Binding Words: Conscience and Rhetoric in Hobbes, Hegel, and Heidegger

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Karen S. Feldman, Binding Words: Conscience and Rhetoric in Hobbes, Hegel, and Heidegger, Northwestern University Press, 2006, 158pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810122612.

Reviewed by John Russon, University of Guelph


This short but provocative book should be of interest to quite a range of philosophers and scholars, ranging from specialists in Hobbes, Hegel or Heidegger to philosophers of language and literary theorists, and even to moral theorists. The thematic questions of the book are exciting and fresh: (1) how are rhetoric and metaphor essential to the textual presentations of the topic of conscience in these philosophers and (2) how are rhetoric and metaphor essential to the very nature of conscience itself? The philosophical orientation that guides Feldman's work is largely derived from Derrida; the work, however, does not rely on Derrida, but is a series of independent studies of the thought -- and the texts -- of Hobbes, Hegel and Heidegger. The interpretations are in each case well-grounded in the original texts and reflect familiarity with a good deal of contemporary English, German and French scholarship on those figures, as well as on the topics of conscience and rhetoric in general. Feldman makes a compelling case for the importance of her theme in each philosopher and in its own right.

According to Hobbes, Feldman argues in Chapter 1, the metaphor of interiority is integral to the invention of private individuality: the "inner life" is "said into being." (27-8, 108) Hobbes's concern is that the term "conscience" has had its meaning corrupted by shifting its sense from "shared witnessing" to "private authority." The application of the term to individual opinions is thus, in truth, a metaphorical use, but it has the effect of validating itself inasmuch as its acceptance engenders a world of isolated individuals who do not live out of a sense of their being beholden to the community. (26-8) It is a misuse (corruption) of words, on Hobbes's account, that is responsible for the corruption of the social space, and, thus, we can see here, in a destructive way, the performative power of metaphor. Though Hobbes is critical of this putatively destructive misuse of language, he has effectively shown, Feldman argues, that such metaphoric performativity is a constitutive possibility of all language. (47) Hobbes's text thus serves to show the political power of metaphor, a power that Hobbes himself powerfully enacts in Leviathan, both in its founding trope of society-as-Leviathan and in its specific analyses. (42-5)

In Hegel, we witness an embrace, rather than a criticism, of this performative power and, indeed, of the phenomenon of individual conscience. The conscientious agent, as Hegel studies this in the Phenomenology of Spirit, is one who takes her own intuition of the right course of action to be authoritative; at the same time, as a self-conscious agent, she depends upon the recognition of her community. (51, 60) Since she turns to nothing and no one outside herself for justification of her intuition, only her own attestation can verify to the community that her action is conscientious. It is only in her affirming her own conscientiousness that her conscientiousness -- which demands both certainty of moral duty and reconciliation with the community -- is accomplished. (61) On the one hand, it is by the expression of her conscience -- in word or deed -- that the agent accomplishes her conscientiousness; on the other hand, though, that self-expression, by virtue of being expressed, is public-domain material, and thus subject to public judgment in terms other than those the agent herself intended. (62-3) Precisely by its efficacy in realizing its expression in the world, conscience outstrips its own authority, and makes its significance subject to the interpretation of others. Hegel's analysis, according to Feldman in Chapter 2, thus attests to the power of language, both to bring into being through its expression that which it expresses (performativity), and (thereby) to set in motion a reality that has effects beyond itself that it cannot contain (rhetoric). (63-4, 73-74) Thus, like Hobbes, Hegel sees conscience as a phenomenon of linguistic performativity. Though, unlike Hobbes, Hegel is not objecting to conscience as a corruption of the proper order of things, he nonetheless demonstrates the failure of conscience inasmuch as conscience can never be adequate to control the reality to which it gives rise.

Hegel's text is interesting for another reason, too, on Feldman's account. Hegel's account of conscience is exemplary for understanding the performative and rhetorical power of language in general, and Hegel's own philosophical argument -- inasmuch as it is a text -- is subject to the same rhetorical interpretation as conscience. The Phenomenology of Spirit is performative, in that it is to be an accomplishment of a development of spirit through its expression; however, it is also rhetorical, which means its meaning (and success) depends on others taking it up. But how its expressions will have effects cannot be foreseen. Like conscience, the Phenomenology cannot guarantee from within itself its own success. (74-79)

Finally, in Chapter 3, Feldman turns to Heidegger's discussion of conscience in Being and Time. Being as such is never reducible to any being; indeed, any being, by virtue of its limited nature, must necessarily be inadequate as a representation of being itself. For that reason, being is ultimately inexpressible except metaphorically: any representation of being will always be made through a being that is necessarily not adequate to being, hence its expressing of being will be metaphorical. (81-6) Conscience, similarly, is irreducible to any specific conscientious act: "[I]n the case of conscience, that which makes present and that which is made present are not facts or things but possibilities and ways, and thus they cannot be made present in the way of actualities." (100) Conscience, like being itself, will always be capable only of metaphoric representation, either by word or deed, for any determinate word or deed will fail to live up to the nature of conscience as such. (98-102) Being and Time as a whole is a text that can never truly be "about" being, but can only be a text that evokes its "subject matter" through the metaphoric excess of its language, and, similarly, the text on conscience cannot be "about" conscience. In its indirection of expression, the text of Being and Time is rigorous: in making of its words "unhandy tools" (86-91) Being and Time attempts to be true to the demands of its "subject". As such, it is itself an attestation of Dasein's ownmost attempt to be itself, "performing for the reader that which the call of conscience demands." (102) In this writing, Heidegger perhaps shows himself to be the truest to the philosophical demands of being, language and conscience itself, for he "yield[s] his place as author to the performativity of language itself." (107)

These three chapters, it seems to me, offer exciting avenues for further exploration. Feldman has demonstrated that -- intentionally or not -- the texts of Hobbes, Hegel and Heidegger, especially in their treatments of conscience, are all richly responsive to the phenomenon of metaphor and the general theme of the performativity of language. Her text makes manifest the importance of conscience as an exemplary case of exemplarity, an exemplary case of an enactment that is simultaneously an accomplishment and a loss of itself.

In my judgment, the book is strongest in its central idea about the exemplary character of conscience, and in the specific themes it draws out of each of the three philosophers studied. It is a very short book, however, and that means that each topic is handled more suggestively than exhaustively. In many ways, it is the chapter on Hobbes that is the most provocative, with its idea that the space of "inner life" is itself brought into being by the very metaphor that describes it, but this is also the chapter that is least fully developed. It is much easier to enunciate this thesis about interiority than it is to articulate what exactly it entails or to defend the claim rigorously, both in general and in relation to Hobbes specifically. The chapter on Hegel is exegetically the fullest, that is, it is the chapter that comes closest to completing the analysis it introduces. Hegel's text on conscience is quite complex, and there is a substantial literature focused on its interpretation. Feldman's chapter is a valuable contribution to this scholarly conversation, and it also has a further valuable feature in its provocative and interesting suggestion regarding the transition from "Spirit" to "Religion" in the Phenomenology. (66-7) The interpretation of Heidegger that Feldman offers involves an interpretation of Being and Time as a whole, and therefore the book is handled only at a high level of generality. Feldman's interpretation of the book is in keeping with current approaches. Her emphasis on the words of Heidegger's text as "unhandy tools," in particular, nicely brings into focus the necessary problem of method and of language that attaches to the "question of being" that orients Heidegger's text, and also meshes well with Heidegger's other writings on language. I do think, though, that in order to present her case here, Feldman overstates the extent to which Heidegger's language is difficult or fails by normal standards.

Overall, Feldman has demonstrated the exemplary philosophical importance of the theme of conscience, and has shown that it is a particularly good theme for bringing the texts of Hobbes, Hegel and Heidegger into relation with each other. The book accomplishes what it sets out to do, and offers a number of fruitful paths for further investigation.