Biodeconstruction: Jacques Derrida and the Life Sciences

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Francesco Vitale, Biodeconstruction: Jacques Derrida and the Life Sciences, Mauro Senatore (tr.), SUNY Press, 2018, 256 pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438468853.

Reviewed by Hans-Jörg Rheinberger, Max Planck Institute for the History of Science


Francesco Vitale has written a remarkable book. It rests on an extended analysis of the largely unpublished seminar La vie la mort that Jacques Derrida gave in the winter of 1975-76. The rumor is widespread that Derrida was more or less agnostic about the scientific developments of his time. This book tells us otherwise. Apparently, Derrida had a deep interest in the development of the life sciences, beginning with the physiological underpinnings of Freud's fin de siècle meta-psychological writings up to mid-twentieth century molecular biology, and including the evolution of humankind. One has only to recall the importance of paleontologist André Leroi-Gourhan's Gesture and Speech, published in two volumes in 1964-65, for establishing the outlines of Derrida's Grammatology. And the greater part of his seminar La vie la mort is devoted to a close reading of François Jacob's La logique du vivant. This book on the history of heredity that the 1965 Nobel Prize winner in physiology or medicine published five years later received almost unanimous praise both as a scientific and a literary event from the Parisian intelligentsia of the time, including Georges Canguilhem, himself a teacher of Derrida, and Michel Foucault.

This volume is about Jacques Derrida's encounters with the life sciences. Vitale devotes his first chapter to exposing Derrida's gesture of deconstruction as it took shape during the 1960s and was epitomized in the notion of "trace," with its roots going back to Derrida's close reading of the late texts of Edmund Husserl, in particular the latter's posthumously published sketch on the Origin of Geometry, and of Freud's early Project for a Scientific Psychology. Chapter II lays out Derrida's reading, with which the seminar begins, of Hegel's conception of life and death, from the Spirit of Christianity to the Science of Logic, the Encyclopedia, and the Philosophy of Nature. Chapters III and IV examine the sessions of the seminar in which Derrida analyses the central concepts of Jacob's Logic of Life -- of which more below -- revolving around the notion of "reproduction" and including his discussion of the phenomena of death and sexuality. The metaphors of program and of text form the central axes along which Vitale develops the argument in these two chapters. The last part of Derrida's seminar is devoted to a reading of Freud's Beyond the Pleasure Principle of 1920, to which Vitale turns in Chapter V. Here, the notion of "binding" is central and testifies to the fact that Freud develops his reflections on the physiological basis of what he sees as the economy of drive or instinct (Trieb) under the spell of early twentieth-century thermodynamics. It is a pity that Vitale misses the chance here to systematically confront the thermodynamic organizing principle of Freud's endeavors with the cybernetic principle of program that dominates Jacob's text. Chapter VI takes up the trope of "autoimmunity" which pervades Derrida's later writings, and connects it to the influential work on cellular suicide (apoptosis) of the French immunologist Jean-Claude Ameisen. The book concludes with a chapter on what Vitale calls the "arche-performative" at work in literary writing that Derrida exemplifies by a close reading of the work of Maurice Blanchot, among others.

That much for a brief survey. Now, some additional remarks on Derrida and Jacob. The central part of the book is devoted to an analysis of Derrida's examination of Jacob's book. Inevitably, what emerges clearly in relation to this unequal couple is the uneasy constellation of a philosopher reading a scientist, and a scientist writing not for philosophers but for a broader public. There is, in this respect, a parallel, and one that Derrida should not have missed. A year before Derrida's seminar, Louis Althusser published his Philosophie et philosophie spontanée des savants, a book that contained his course in philosophy for students of the sciences which he held in the winter of 1967-68, and which contained a critique of Jacques Monod's inaugural lecture at the Collège de France from the fall of 1967. In the same way that Althusser treats Monod, Derrida embarks on a critique of Jacob's "spontaneous philosophy," to use Althusser's term. We can also be fairly certain that another inaugural lecture at the Collège, that of Jacob in May 1965, had not escaped the attention of the pre-Grammatology Derrida. That lecture contained, in nuce, the message that Jacob developed into a book in the years that followed. Reading these two chapters of Vitale's dissection of Derrida's critique, what particularly interested me was his discussion of the latter's deconstruction of Jacob's use of the concept of "model" when engaging with the tropes of language, writing, and text in relation to the processes of hereditary transmission. Looked at more closely, the model itself displays the logic of the trace: it always leaves something to be desired. This idea was beautifully expounded in Canguilhem's reflections on the use of models in biology, as well as in Claude Lévi-Strauss's La pensée sauvage, another of the outstanding publications that flooded Paris in the decade between 1960 and 1970. And there is yet a further interesting aside to Derrida's engagement with the molecular biologist's book. He takes the pervasive function of the language of text and writing throughout the literature of molecular biology as a sign for the approaching end of the two scientific cultures: "Therefore, how can we still oppose the science of nature to -- to what? -- to the science of culture, society, man, and spirit?" (La vie la mort, 4.15, cited on p. 110)

But then the ways part. Whereas Althusser uses Monod's text to exemplify his conception of philosophy as an epistemology of drawing distinctions -- politics in theory, Derrida uses Jacob's text to highlight the movement of différance as an ontological movement, as it were, a movement that he sees at work in the innermost core of the living and that he follows from there through the structure of the psychic apparatus as developed in Freud's reflections in Beyond the Pleasure Principle, to the act of literary writing, including his own. Seen through Vitale's lens, Derrida conceives of his own work, on the one hand, as a thorough deconstruction of the occidental metaphysics of presence with its classical oppositions -- presence-absence, life-death, identity-contradiction, to name but a few -- and as an all-encompassing critique, not from without, but from within. On the other hand, Vitale understands Derrida's work not as an epistemology, but rather as something like a metaphysics of evolution extending from the elementary features of the most rudimentary forms of the living right through the human psyche to the cultural achievements of humankind, be it the sciences, the arts, economics, politics, you name it. Throughout his book, Vitale repeats this perspective on Derrida in various forms, for example: "The empirical text, the machine, or the factory can be taken up as models of the living as they are products of the living, specific differential articulations of the self-reproduction that structures the living according to the dynamic of general textuality and arche-writing." (125)

Are there deflationary alternatives to such a reading of Derrida's work as a radically secularized, but nevertheless, an onto-theology? Derrida himself appears ambiguous at times with respect to such a positioning, and this ambiguity should not be written out of his oeuvre. Let us recall the famous passage on the notion of "program" in his Grammatology, where he anticipates a historical horizon to the "field of writing," a horizon extending only "until its historical-metaphysical belonging is also denounced." (Of Grammatology, p. 9). We can only speculate why Derrida left the parts of the seminar dealing with the Logic of Life, in contrast to those dealing with the conceptions of life/death in the writings of Nietzsche and in Heidegger's reading of Nietzsche, as well as those of Freud, essentially unpublished. Could we surmise that he might have felt uneasy with, on the one hand, criticizing Jacob's presumably unreflected use of the classical dichotomies of Western thought, and on the other hand, firmly reading "arche-trace" and "arche-writing" into his text? It certainly did not escape Derrida's attention that Jacob himself, at the end of his book, clearly saw his conceptualizations of the living and those of molecular genetics in general as marked by an indelible historical index: "Today the world is messages, codes and information. Tomorrow what analysis will break down our objects to reconstitute them in a new space?" (The Logic of Life, 1973, 324) In the end, both Jacob's logic and Derrida's deconstruction are animated by this vital ambiguity: they have a tinge of ontology as well as of historical epistemology.