Biodiversity and Environmental Philosophy: An Introduction

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Sahotra Sarkar, Biodiversity and Environmental Philosophy: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 258pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521851327.

Reviewed by Kevin deLaplante, Iowa State University


Sahotra Sarkar's Biodiversity and Environmental Philosophy: An Introduction (hereafter, BEP) will likely confound readers expecting a user-friendly introduction to topics and issues in environmental philosophy.  The book is better described as a high-level introduction to normative and conceptual issues in the science of conservation biology -- indeed, the first such book written by a philosopher of science.  The normative issues in question have considerable overlap with normative issues in environmental philosophy, and the first half of the book is devoted to topics familiar to environmental philosophers (anthropocentrism vs. nonanthropocentrism, intrinsic value, deep ecology, the wilderness debate, etc.), so the title isn't entirely misleading.  But the second half of the book is focused almost entirely on epistemological and conceptual issues in conservation biology, and more specifically on a tradition of conservation biology dubbed "systematic conservation planning".  Theoretical work in this tradition is often highly formal, focusing on decision-theoretic models and algorithms for solving multi-criteria optimization problems.  Consider, for example, this sentence from Chapter 6, which expresses one form of the so-called "place prioritization" problem in systematic conservation planning:

Given a set of places Σ, a set of surrogates Λ, and a list of surrogates λi ⊆ Λ for each place σi ∈ Σ, and a target τi for each λi ⊆ Λ, prioritize all places in Σ in such a way that the targets are all met in a set Π of the lowest cardinality that is possible.  (p. 161)

This level of formalism only shows up in one or two places in the book, but it's enough to signal that BEP isn't for the novice.  I wouldn't recommend it to the casual student looking for a gentle introduction into the environmental philosophy literature.

On the other hand, I strongly recommend the book to anyone interested in the history and philosophy of conservation biology and the relation of this field to the traditional problems of environmental philosophy.  It will be of particular value to philosophers of biology and ecology, and environmental philosophers who pay close attention to developments in ecology and conservation science.

As noted, the first half of BEP deals primarily with the normative foundations of conservation biology, while the second half addresses scientific and conceptual issues in biodiversity science and systematic conservation planning.  I'll begin with a summary of the central claims of the book, and conclude with a discussion of Sarkar's position on the relationship between conservation biology and ecology. 

Key Theses

Sarkar makes a number of strong claims in BEP.  I suspect that commentary from environmental philosophers will focus on one or more of the following theses advanced in the first half of the book:

1.  that the most common arguments for conservation based on the "intrinsic value" of biological or ecological entities are insufficient to protect general biodiversity or generate moral obligations toward these entities (Chapter 3);

2.  that an adequate conservation ethic can be developed based on the "transformative value" of biodiversity for humans (i.e. its capacity to transform the felt preferences (or "demand values") of human beings) (Chapter 4);

3.  that "the best argument for the conservation of biodiversity" is grounded in the contribution that the study of biodiversity has played, and continues to play, in advancing our scientific understanding of the natural world, and human intellectual life more broadly (pp. 85-86).

Commentary from philosophers of biology and ecology, on the other hand, will likely focus on one or more of the following theses advanced in the second half of the book:

4.  that ecology has no generally accepted global principles (p. 109);

5.  that general ecological models have by and large not proven useful for conservation biology (p. 127);

6.  that reductionistic research traditions in ecology are epistemically superior to holistic research traditions, and in the form of individual-based models coupled with GIS technology, have the greatest chance of contributing usefully to conservation planning and theoretical ecology generally (pp. 127-132);

7.  that our best estimates of current and past extinction rates do not warrant the widespread belief that human activity is precipitating a mass extinction comparable to the mass extinctions of the geological past (pp. 132-144);

8.  that there is no single definition of "biodiversity" that captures everything that conservation biologists want to preserve (pp. 178-184);

9.  that there is an emerging "consensus view" on how conservation biology should be practiced that integrates elements of the Australian and American approaches to conservation biology, and that this view focuses on systematic conservation planning and adaptive management of landscapes (pp. 150-151);

10.  that the consensus view of conservation biology has as much in common with the human social sciences as the natural biological sciences, and consequently that the common view of conservation biology as an applied branch of the natural science of ecology is mistaken (p. 159).

Every one of these theses is contentious from one theoretical perspective or another.  Environmental philosophers who are disposed toward anthropocentrism will likely concur with much of Sarkar's critical review of nonanthropocentric approaches in environmental philosophy, but nonanthropocentrists will object that he hasn't given the best intrinsic value arguments their proper due.  Ecologists and philosophers of ecology who have a higher regard for the theoretical achievements of ecology, or who are more sympathetic to holistic research methodologies, will take issue with elements of Sarkar's discussion of models and principles of ecological theory.  And many conservation biologists will question whether Sarkar's canonization of systematic conservation planning as the "consensus view" of conservation biology isn't simply a bald attempt to promote one particular conservation program within a field that is arguably much broader in scope.

That said, BEP features Sarkar's trademark rigor and analytical clarity, his presentation of the history of conservation biology and of the conceptual challenges facing the field is clear and comprehensive, and his summary of the methodology of systematic conservation planning is excellent.  For students of conservation science interested in systematic methods for biodiversity conservation, BEP is the most accessible introduction to the field yet published.  For philosophers, BEP is a rich source of arguments that I'm sure will stimulate discussion for years to come. 

Conservation Biology and Ecology

I'd like to conclude with a mild challenge to Sarkar's claim that conservation biology should not be viewed as a branch of applied ecology.  The motivation for this conclusion is straightforward enough.  The main challenges of conservation biology -- as conceived within the framework of systematic conservation planning and landscape management -- are primarily problems of human decision-making under conditions of uncertainty, rather than traditional problems of scientific theorizing and testing of empirical hypotheses.  These decision problems require input from the natural sciences of course, but also from the social sciences, formal decision theory, and in formulating and prioritizing conservation goals, from normative ethics as well.  As Sarkar describes the methodology of systematic conservation planning (pp. 151-178), traditional ecological models of population, community and ecosystem ecology play a relatively minor role in the framework (though certain kinds of population models may be useful for assessing the viability of conservation targets).  If we accept the orthodox conception of ecology as a branch of the natural biological sciences aimed at describing, explaining and predicting patterns in the distribution and abundance of organisms, then it is simply a mistake to view conservation biology as a subset of ecology.  Conservation biology is a multidisciplinary (transdisciplinary?) field that spans the natural and social sciences, and indeed the humanities; ecology, by contrast, is best viewed as a biological discipline within the natural sciences. 

This line of reasoning rests entirely on accepting the orthodox conception of ecology as a branch of the natural, biological sciences.  There is, however, a long tradition of ecological thought that conceives ecology in a more expansive mode, as a field that properly spans both the natural and social sciences (e.g. Taylor 1936, Haskell 1940, Friedrichs 1958).  This more expansive tradition of ecological science is motivated in part by the belief that ecology is a science of organism-environment relations that properly includes the study of human-environment relations (e.g. Adams 1935, Odum 1977, Catton 1994, O'Neill and Kahn 2000, Walker et al 2006).  On this view, human ecology is a legitimate branch of ecology, and all the various branches of conservation science, including conservation biology, can be conceived as problems for applied human ecology.  Conservation biology may be a multidisciplinary science, but it falls within the domain of ecology because ecology is in reality a multidisciplinary science of even broader scope.

Now, Sarkar might grant the in-principle conceptual point about the multidisciplinary status of ecology, but nevertheless still have good reason to resist promoting conservation biology as an applied branch of ecology.  There is a growing appreciation among conservation biologists that, despite the early manifestos that called for the creation of a truly multidisciplinary conservation biology (e.g. Soulé 1985), the field continues to be dominated by individuals trained in the orthodox mode of ecological science (population and community ecology, biogeochemistry, research statistics, mathematical modeling using differential and difference equations, etc.), and it is this conception of ecology that is most commonly assumed in discussions of the relationship of ecology to conservation biology.  Hence, if one's goal is to draw more workers from computer science, social science and ethics into conservation biology (as systematic conservation planning demands), and these workers don't generally view themselves as ecologists, then it might make greater strategic sense to couch the call for participation in terms of interdisciplinary collaboration between computer scientists, social scientists, ethicists and ecologists, rather than in terms of a less-widely shared expansive conception of ecology that may be perceived as assimilating all of these distinct contributions under a single disciplinary framework.  To sum up, while there may be no in-principle conceptual barrier to viewing conservation biology as entirely within the domain of ecology, there may nevertheless be good pragmatic reasons for promoting conservation biology as a multidisciplinary field of which ecology is viewed as just one disciplinary component.  I believe this represents Sarkar's own position on the matter (personal communication).

This reasoning is persuasive as far as it goes, but I would add that there can be pragmatic reasons for promoting the more expansive conception of ecology as well (see deLaplante 2004).  Generally speaking, the needs of multidisciplinary science are not well served by disciplinary and professional traditions that draw sharp boundaries between the natural and social sciences and the humanities.  There are many workers in ecologically oriented disciplines within the social sciences (e.g. ecological anthropology, ecological sociology, historical ecology, ecological economics, etc.) who may be in a position to contribute productively to multidisciplinary conservation efforts, but whose work remains unknown to ecologists and conservation scientists.  The chances of productive engagement between workers in these otherwise segregated disciplines may be improved by encouraging a disciplinary culture that views all efforts to study human-environment relations as part of a common intellectual project. 

This line of reasoning doesn't necessarily invalidate the pragmatic argument for maintaining a separation between ecology and conservation biology outlined previously, since it is really addressing a different set of worries.  But if the main concern is promoting a culture of multidisciplinarity within the sciences and humanities, then it will be necessary to tailor arguments for specific audiences, and it's not hard to imagine an audience that is moved more by the rhetoric of a multidisciplinary expansive ecology than by the rhetoric of traditional disciplinary specialization.


Sahotra Sarkar's Biodiversity and Environmental Philosophy: An Introduction is the first book by a philosopher of science on the conceptual foundations of conservation biology.  The book covers an unusually broad set of topics, from normative foundations of conservation ethics to technical issues in algorithmic procedures for systematic conservation planning.  Most readers will come to the book with a background either in environmental philosopher or in the philosophy and science of conservation biology; either set of readers will likely encounter patches that are rough going.  But the book is rich and rewards repeated reading.  Though I wouldn't recommend it to the casual student looking for an easy introduction to environmental philosophy, I do strongly recommend it to serious students and professionals working in environmental philosophy and to conservation biologists and philosophers of science interested in the conceptual foundations of an emerging multidisciplinary field. 


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