Biological Complexity and Integrative Pluralism

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Mitchell, Sandra, Biological Complexity and Integrative Pluralism, Cambridge, 2003, 260pp, $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521520797.

Reviewed by Anya Plutynski, University of Utah


Sandra Mitchell’s Biological Complexity and Integrative Pluralism, the latest in Michael Ruse’s Cambridge Series in Philosophy of Biology, is an interesting and provocative book. Mitchell’s project is a worthy one: to carve out a middle ground between “anything goes” pluralism and reductionism in biology. Her thesis is that the biological world is complex, and, this complexity, plus the limitations of our representations, requires explanation via a plurality of models and theories deployed at multiple levels in the biological sciences. So far, her project will, I think, be well met by biologists and philosophers of biology. Mitchell also clarifies points of dispute concerning the units of selection debate, critiques adaptationism, defends an etiological account of functions, argues for a pragmatic account of laws, and defends what she calls the “critical” and “integrative pluralist” perspective. It is indeed a comprehensive and ambitious book, both complex and pluralistic.

But what is complexity? And what is integrative pluralism? The first half of Mitchell’s book addresses the former question, the second half addresses the latter question.

Part I: Complexity

Complexity, it turns out, is not one thing, but many. Mitchell describes three different categories of complexity – constitutive (or, compositional) complexity, dynamical complexity, and evolved complexity.

What is constitutive complexity? How do we measure, or compare, different degrees of constitutive complexity? Which structures or compositions are more or less complex? Mitchell answers as follows, “complex systems can be distinguished from simple objects by having multiple parts that stand in nonsimple relations. That is, there is structure or order in the way in which the whole is composed of parts” (p. 5). Mitchell’s examples of objects exhibiting constitutive complexity include cells, organisms, and collections of species, insect colonies, and ecosystems. In short, almost every level of the biological hierarchy is constitutively complex. Mitchell suggests that the key to constitutive complexity is minimally, “having parts” and further, that these parts have “organization”. This minimal characterization naturally invites the following questions. What constitutes organization, according to Mitchell? Are the boxy symmetrical cells that one may see when looking at a cork under a microscope organized? How is this sort of “organization” commensurable with the organization of division of labor in social insects, if at all?

In chapter two, Mitchell (and Page, the chapter is a reprint of their 1995 paper) consider one vivid example of constitutive complexity, social insect colonies. They give a nuanced description of the many forms of organization of social insects, and how such organization may arise. Mitchell and Page argue that these different forms of organization in social insects are the products of several different kinds of process sometimes acting simultaneously – selective and non-selective, and at varying levels of the hierarchy.

Mitchell and Page’s project is to reply to Wilson and Sober (1989) and Seely (1989). Wilson and Sober argue for the revival of the superorganism metaphor. Insofar as social insects are “functionally organized”, they argue, groups of such insects are not unlike an individual organism. They argue that group-level selection is operating in such cases, given sufficient inter-group heritable variation in survivorship. Mitchell and Page claim that Wilson and Sober’s sense of functional organization is “restricted to organization around reproduction,” and is thus implicitly committed to “Weismannism,” understood as “preformationist” division of germ plasm and soma. More precisely, they argue that Wilson and Sober’s conditions on the possibility of group level selection are too restrictive. One of these conditions is no intra-group competition. Mitchell and Page argue that this “makes invisible the diverse array of truly hierarchical organization found in social insects on which hierarchical selection can operate” (p. 30).

To be charitable, perhaps Wilson and Sober made the specification of no intra-group competition in order to rule out the possibility of calling a herd of fleet deer a fleet herd. In other words, perhaps they were not ruling out the possibility of hierarchical selection per se. (They certainly endorse multiple levels of selection later, in Sober and Wilson, 1998.) They may merely have been attempting to make precise when something is and is not group selection; and thus, when an adaptation is the product of group-level selection and when the same adaptation is better identified as the product of individual selection. Whether or not this is so, Mitchell and Page do bring our attention to a number of interesting possible causes of social insect organization.

The possibility of emergent order is supported by computer simulation models documented at some length in the following chapter, “Dynamical complexity.” What then is, “dynamical complexity”? Mitchell includes under this category nonlinear mathematical functions, any process with extreme sensitivity to initial conditions, “self-organizing” processes, recursive patterns, negative and positive feedback regimes, processes where higher-level order emerges from simple interactions of complex parts, division of labor, and order emerging from interaction of components of a system (p. 6).

The third chapter illustrates one such instance of dynamical complexity, the emergence of order from simple interactions of parts. They show how a stable equilibrium of division of social roles in insects may arise simply as a result of a simple feedback process operating at the individual level, whereby behavior is responsive to a threshold of some stimulus.

The fourth chapter, which closes the first part of Mitchell’s book on complexity, is entitled “Evolved Diversity”. The subject of the this chapter is not diversity per se, but rather a careful analysis of the units of selection debate, along with a critique of adaptationist explanations (especially in sociobiology), and of univocal accounts of “function” talk. Mitchell’s project is to show how attempts to proffer single, univocal answers to the philosophical questions, concerning “the” unit of selection, or “the” preferred definition of function are flawed. Her analysis in this chapter is one of the most lucid discussions in the book. Here she exhibits a great ability to step back from a debate and see why and how the authors of competing views are talking past each other. Her major criticism of both Brandon and Dawkins concerns their different ways of characterizing the problem of the “unit” of selection.

Part Ii: Integrative Pluralism

In the second half of her book, Mitchell contends that the complexity of nature argues for a plurality of models, theories and explanations. This pluralistic view is not, however, “promiscuous”. Mitchell’s is a “critical pluralism” which “recognizes pluralist ontologies and methodologies” as well as a “multiplicity of models, theoretical approaches and explanations,” but does not endorse the thesis that “anything scientists accept goes,” nor, that “all, possibly inconsistent theories that emerge” ought to be retained (pp. 179-180). This view seems on its face to leave a wide range of options open. Let us see what Mitchell’s critical and integrative pluralism looks like in practice.

One feature of this sort of pluralism, according to Mitchell, is a pragmatism about laws of nature. Mitchell points out, (as have Beatty, 1995, Brandon, 1997), that the candidates for laws in biology do not meet the “traditional” normative criteria for laws. For example, Mendel’s laws describe what does happen, most of the time (barring meiotic drive or “selfish genes”), for diploid sexual species. They are not exceptionless, universal generalizations. Biological laws more generally fail to meet the standard requirements on law-likeness: truth, universality, and “modal force.” There are two sorts of strategies philosophers of biology have adopted in reaction to this observation. They either (1) reject the claim that science contains laws at all, or, (2) offer a new conception of law.

Mitchell takes the second strategy. Her thesis is that that law-likeness is not an either-or, but rather a more-or-less, property. Along the continuum of what she considers lawful generalizations are the law of conservation of mass-energy, Mendel’s law of independent assortment, and the fact that all the coins in Goodman’s pocket are made of copper. Each of these generalizations is true, but could have been false; as she says, their “contingency” is a matter of degree. Mitchell adds that there are several “dimensions” or continuums of this sort along which different scientific laws fall. Laws are more or less contingent, stable, strong, and abstract. Each of these dimensions describes a different property of law-likeness, and whether we want a law that is more or less abstract, strong, or what have you, will be determined by scientific context.

Mitchell is correct to point out that many things that scientists call laws (1) do not meet the conditions on law-likeness that philosophers have hoped for, and (2) do have these properties of greater and lesser abstractness, contingency, and so on. Mitchell writes that “By focusing discussion on laws versus accidental generalizations, natural necessity versus contingency,… one is saddled with a dichotomous conceptual framework that fails to display important differences between the kinds of causal structure found in our world and differences in the corresponding scientific representations of those structures” (p. 138). She is right that it is a mistake to rule out biological modes of explanation as problematic simply on the grounds that they depend upon “contingent” generalizations, and these distinctions between “contingent” and “necessary” should prompt questioning. What do we mean when we refer to laws as more or less “contingent,” or “lawlike” as opposed to “accidental”? Mitchell argues that all laws are in some sense contingent, but this point seems not to address these questions so much as set them to one side.

We don’t have to “dichotomize” in order to wonder why it is that the fact that all the coins in Goodman’s pocket are copper seems less than lawlike, or less than explanatory. Counting this among the laws of nature seems, at the very least, to be counterintuitive. And, perhaps we should not set our intuitions aside so swiftly. Pragmatist theories of explanation have taught us well that whether or not a statement explains is a matter of context; or, what will count as a good answer to some question depends upon what sorts of contrast classes are presupposed. And, Mitchell is correct that generalizations with different degrees of contingency, strength, or abstraction are more or less useful in different scientific contexts. However, these observations seem to pass over the hard problem of scientific explanation. What are scientific explanations for? How does the answer to this question vary in different scientific contexts? Do all scientific explanations require laws? Do they require laws at all? One need not be a “normativist” in order to view these questions as philosophically interesting. Her pragmatism, while very sensible, seems to favor pluralistic inclusion over widening the domain of philosophical questions even further.

The advantage of Mitchell’s approach is that it renders biology legitimate, at least insofar as we wish biological explanations to follow the deductive nomological model. However, perhaps this gives too much ground to Smart and Hempel. Why does Mitchell want to save the concept of law? She claims that “biologists think they use laws all the time to explain and predict” (p. 146). However, this claim runs counter to at least some biologists characterization of their own work (Lewontin, 2000, Mayr, 1982) While some explanations in biology may appeal to laws, on some loose conception of “law,” it seems that most explanations in biology have the form of “how possibly” model building or historical narrative. More often than not, biologists construct a model or narrative and argue by appealing to several independent lines of evidence that this model or narrative may account for the phenomena. In other words, biological explanations have more of the structure of a “how possibly” story, where it is well understood that our models are idealized and imperfect, and may or may not reflect all or most casual factors at work in generating some pattern or process. Further, it is not clear that all biological explanations are necessarily causal explanations. Sometimes a model will simply show how a set of data fits a model that deploys statistical estimates of “branch lengths” of phylogenetic trees, number of segregating sites, mean pairwise nucleotide differences, or mutation rates, without making any specific “on the ground” causal hypotheses about how we got from there to here. Mitchell might quibble about whether these are explanations at all, insofar as such explanations do not necessarily “reflect the causal structure of the world” (p. 149). But the insistence that all explanations reflect “causal dependency relations” seems less than pluralistic. Are there dependency relations that are not causal but nonetheless explanatory? When and how does something count as a causal explanation? Is there a privileged level at which “causes” operate? Are there population level causes? Or, are causes always “on the ground,” or, acting at the level of the individual organism viz. its environment?

In the last chapter of the book, Mitchell defends what she calls “integrative pluralism”. Mitchell begins this chapter by describing what she takes to be views at opposing ends of the spectrum: “promiscuous” pluralism of the sort endorsed by Dupre, and the unity of science via reduction. According to Mitchell, a “long advocated” view is that the unity of science will be “forged by the reduction of the special sciences to physics.” While there are certainly a few who endorse reductionist projects, and also those who endorse the view that science is more or less unified, there are many flavors of reduction, and many senses of unity. Mitchell seems to group all such projects under the same heading, claiming that those who endorse unification also endorse reductionism, and moreover, all such persons believe that there will be “simple derivability relationships between accounts of macroscopic and microscopic phenomena.” It’s not clear that this view was ever advocated. Even those most sympathetic to the project (e.g. Kemeny and Oppenheim, 1956) acknowledged that there would be no “simple” derivability between macro- and micro- sciences. They argued that there needed to be complex bridge principles connecting higher and lower level sciences.

Here, roughly, is Mitchell’s argument for pluralism, contra the purported reductionists (p. 182-186):

  • Reductionism does not capture the realities of scientific practice.
  • Reductionism requires a simple mirroring relationship between theory and world.
  • Scientific representations are abstractions, or idealizations; they are only partial descriptions.
  • Actual objects and events are instances of objects of multiple abstract theories.
  • Abstractions (theoretical objects at different levels) are not identifiable across levels.

There is a standard objection to this argument that Mitchell raises herself (p. 184). Whether or not reductionism is in fact a good way of characterizing science, the question is whether in principle reduction is possible. Here is Mitchell’s argument against in principle reduction:

  • Reductionists are committed to “causal closure” (Roughly, that description at the “physical or material” level is sufficient to describe the causal interactions responsible for all changes of state.)
  • “Patterns in the world that we identify as causal” may depend upon structural characteristics of complex objects as much as on material characteristics.
  • Structure is “one level up from the physical level, and is causally significant.”
  • Therefore, causal closure is false.
  • In principle reductionism cannot hold.

This argument leads to the following questions. When may we be sure that the “patterns in the world that we identify as causal” depend on “structural features of the world”? What kind of features does she have in mind? When are these features robust, such that no even in principle micro-level explanation might supplant them?

What is Mitchell’s alternative to reductionism and “anything goes” pluralism? “Integrative pluralism,” she says, comes in several flavors: mechanical rules integration, theoretical unification, and explanatory, concrete integration. The first is just to show that two processes may be understood as causally significant in the same domain – for instance, force due to electromagnetic and gravitational attraction. The second is more or less unification along the lines of Friedman and Kitcher’s notion of theoretical unification – except, she says, “the appropriate scope of the unity will be settled by a combination of pragmatic and ontological constraints.” Finally, “explanatory or concrete integration,” is when a “large number of partially independent factors participate in structuring a process, and where these factors span time and dimension scales as well as scientific disciplines” (p. 192).

Why are these cases of “pluralistic” integration rather than different forms of explanatory or theoretical “unifications”? Mitchell has identified the reductionist project with the unificationist one. But surely, one can endorse local theoretical unifications and cases of explanatory unification without endorsing the unity of science writ large? What is “integrative pluralism” other than a very cautious endorsement of explanatory or theoretical unification?

It seems that one of the themes of Mitchell’s book is a warning against reification of simple or idealized models of biological patterns or processes. The natural world is complex, and so our models should be as well. However, Mitchell also says that our representations of the world are partial. There seems to be a tension underlying this view. In part due to our cognitive limitations, and in part due to the heuristic or pragmatic reasons, our representations of the world are arguably necessarily partial and idealized. Moreover, idealization and simplification are often not only necessary, but very useful in getting a “big picture,” or, as Salmon says, accomplishing a “Weltanschauung” type explanation. Mitchell herself (along with Page) uses a highly idealized computer simulation to model insect social roles. When and why are these sorts of idealization and simplification dangerous? As a pragmatist, Mitchell would presumably endorse the thesis that we may idealize and simplify in some cases but not others, depending upon our purposes? Mitchell’s book prompts the further question, which purposes warrant idealization and when have we gone too far?

Mitchell discusses some fascinating biological case studies (e.g. the evolution of the clitoris), and has illuminating insights on a number of topics. Her treatment of the levels and units of selection debate, adaptationism, functions, and laws is both clear and provocative.


Beatty, 1995. “The Evolutionary Contingency Thesis,” In G. Wolters and J. G. Lennox, eds. Concepts, Theories and Rationality in the Biological Sciences. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press: 45-81.

Brandon, 1997. “Does Biology Have Laws? The Experimental Evidence.” Philosophy of Science 64 (4): S444-S457.

Kemeny and Oppenheim, 1956. “On Reduction,” Philosophical Studies. 7, 6-19.

Lewontin, 2000. “What do population geneticists know?” In, Creath and Maienschein, eds., Biology and epistemology. In: The Cambridge studies in philosophy and biology. Cambridge [England]; New York : Cambridge University Press, 2000.

Mayr, 1982. The Growth of Biological Thought: Evolution, Diversity and Inheritance. Cambridge: Belknap Press.

Seely, 1989. “The Honeybee Colony as a Superorganism.” American Scientist 77: 546-553.

Sober and Wilson, 1999. Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Wilson and Sober, 1989. “Reviving the Superorganism.” Journal of Theoretical Biology 136: 337-336.