Biological Individuality: Integrating Scientific, Philosophical, and Historical Perspectives

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Scott Lidgard and Lynn K. Nyhart (eds.), Biological Individuality: Integrating Scientific, Philosophical, and Historical Perspectives, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 400 pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226446455.

Reviewed by Pierrick Bourrat, Macquarie University


What is a biological individual? This is the main question this edited collection attempts to answer and intuitively it seems an easy one. Biological entities that are in some ways autonomous, clearly distinct from their environment, able to maintain their integrity and able to feed and reproduce will count as individuals. But when the question is deepened, it becomes clear that none of these criteria apply generally to all the objects that have been referred to by the term biological individual. Take, for instance, the quaking aspen. This species of tree, very common in Canada, create forests of clonal trees that all belong to a single root system (Bouchard 2008). One would intuitively consider every tree, delineated by a single trunk, as an individual. However, all these trees are physiologically characterized as belonging to one single individual because they all belong to the same root system. The most famous of these large individuals is known as 'Pando' and considered the oldest and heaviest individual on earth. Pando is an individual that does not reproduce but persists and grows. The quaking aspen is not the only species with this mode of persistence. It can be found in other plants and fungi, as well as in the animal kingdom. The Portuguese man o'war is another curiosity. This species belongs to an order closely related to that of jellyfish: siphonophores. Siphonophores form colonies composed of individual entities called zooids. Zooids are multicellular organisms which are able to move freely and reproduce by budding. Yet each zooid is so specialized that it could not survive on its own and thus needs the colony. Some zooids are specialized in the reproduction of the colony. The Portuguese man o'war is intriguing because it is unclear whether the zooids, the whole colony, or both these entities should be considered an individual.

These examples are only two exemplars of a long list of species that challenge an intuitive conception of biological individuality. It is thus not surprising that the different disciplines within biology, e.g., evolutionary biology, physiology, immunology, and taxonomy, have all adopted pragmatic definitions of individuality that track some of our intuitions about biological individuality. John Pepper and Matthew Herron (2008), Ellen Clarke (2010), and Lidgard and Nyhart in the volume, review many of these definitions (9 for Pepper and Herron, 13 for Clarke, 24 for Lidgard and Nyhart). Each of the chapters of this collection illustrates neatly the point that, when it comes to biological individuality, there is both unity and disunity in meanings: unity in the sense that each chapter appeals to common intuitions about biological individuality, and disunity in the sense that in each chapter biological individuality has a different meaning.

The book is very ambitious in that, instead of focusing on one or two related biological individuality concepts, it aims at giving a general feel of how this term has emerged and developed through time and across different disciplines. One risk with such an aim is the production of a collection of mostly unrelated chapters that are only loosely connected with one another. Yet, as Nyhart and Lidgard write in the opening sentence of the book: "This volume is premised on the idea that biologists, historians of biology, and philosophers of biology can learn more about individuals and individuality by working in concert than by working separately." Overall, I believe that the volume succeeds in showing how each discipline can illuminate one or several aspects of the notion of biological individuality as it is used in other disciplines. I think this is in particular due to the opening and ending chapters. The opening chapter by Lidgard and Nyhart is both an historical and theoretical synthesis of the notion of biological individuality. The concluding chapter by Alan C. Love and Ingo Brigandt is a philosophical analysis of the notion. Both chapters serve as glue that binds the collection together. Without them, as well as the commentary by James Elwick (Chapter 11) and Scott Gilbert (Chapter 12), the collection would have been much less successful in reaching its aim. Although not an historian myself, I appreciated the historical dimension of the book, which allowed me to realize how contemporary philosophical questions were already at the heart of earlier accounts of biological individuality and related themes.

The book contains 13 chapters, 11 of which are independent essays (including the philosophical analysis of Love and Brigandt) and two of which are the comments by Elwick and Gilbert. Among the 11 chapters, six take a historical focus, while the others are more philosophical or theoretically oriented. Being a philosopher of biology with training in evolutionary biology, I will mostly focus on the philosophical and theoretical aspects of the book, leaving historians to comment on the historical aspects.

After the impressive review of the different scientific and philosophical problems associated with the notion of biological individuality in different contexts by Lidgard and Nyhart, Matthew Herron focuses on the transition from uni- to multi- cellularity using the volvocine green algae lineage as a way to approach the problem of biological individuality. In this lineage there are different species with different sizes and levels of complexity. From there, Herron proposes a model in 12 steps for a transition from uni- to multi- cellularity. The main point of this model is to show that evolutionary transitions in individuality are progressive rather than sudden, so that different types of cell colonies can exhibit different degrees of individuality, which itself will depend on the criteria employed to characterize individuality.

Beckett Sterner argues that a theory of evolutionary transitions in individuality based solely on multilevel selection theory is insufficient to fully account for evolutionary transitions in individuality. Sterner proposes an alternative framework based on the concept of 'demarcator'. Demarcators are causal mechanisms that permit the individuation of biological entities at a higher level of organization. There are some convergences here with Clarke's (2013) proposition that individuality is realized when a biological entity exhibits both policing mechanisms and demarcating mechanisms.

Andrew Reynolds starts by showing how sociological terms and concepts have been imported into biology and continue to play an important role when referring to cell-cell interactions, part-whole relationships, and transitions from uni- to multi- cellularity. Reynolds argues that one important consideration in transitions from unicelluar to multicellular organisms is cell-cell communication.

In their second essay, Nyhart and Lidgard proposes a history of how the concept of 'alternation of generations' around the first half of the nineteenth century shaped discussions about biological individuality. The notion of alternations of generations is a difficult one to capture. It characterizes the life cycle of some species, in which the members of this species with the form A produce entities with the form B which in turn produce A. The criteria considered to distinguish A from B can vary from one author to another and across time. It might be decided purely on a morphological basis, or on the presence of a sexual and an asexual phase in the life cycle. Nyhart and Lidgard demonstrate that discussions on biological individuality were motivated in the period they discuss by the difficulty of reconciling a traditional or intuitive notion of individuality with species exhibiting alternation of generations. This nicely illustrates the point that many contemporary themes on biological individuality were already present in that period of history.

Snait Gissis presents the work of Herbert Spencer under a new light. More particularly, Gissis shows how much considerations about the interaction between the organism and the environment were important for Spencer in his treatment of the notion of biological individuality and how they emerge in evolution. Gissis's chapter, like that of Nyhart and Lidgard, is another demonstration that many of the contemporary questions about biological individuality were already present in the 19th century.

Olivier Rieppel presents an analysis of the concept of Enkapsis, developed by the anatomist Martin Heidenhain in the early 20th century to demarcate different levels of organization within a multicellular organism. Rieppel shows how this concept was used in different contexts, from ecology to politics.

Michael Osborne develops an historical account of the notion of a parasite, more particularly, how this notion was related to the notions of symbiosis and individuality in the context of French colonialism at the end of the nineteenth and early twentieth century. Osborne shows how these notions infused French politics and reflection about the colonial state.

Hannah Landecker discusses the notion of individuality from a metabolic perspective. She retraces the history of the notion of metabolism back to Claude Bernard, the French father of physiology. Roughly speaking, metabolism is characterized by the ability of an entity to transform food into itself. Landecker shows, however, that this notion of metabolism, classically associated with that of an individual, is challenged by today's research in biology and the biomedical sciences.

Ingo Brigandt pleads for a loosening of the distinction between structure and function classically found in biology. Brigandt argues that functions, like structures, are parts of complex wholes. He then proceeds to show that loosening this distinction can be beneficial for scientific theorizing.

The last three chapters are comments on the ten chapters I have presented. I discuss them in the reminder of this review, with a focus on the analysis provided by Love and Brigandt, and with some general comments of my own.

The reader of this book will likely be left with the overall feeling that the quest for a unique concept of biological individuality that would subsume all uses in all biological disciplines is doomed. The concept of individuality used by Herron, Sterner and Reynolds in their respective chapters, which concerns evolution -- more particularly how higher-level individuals come into being from the interaction of lower-level ones over evolutionary time -- seems fundamentally different from the notions of biological individuality used in other contexts. In an evolutionary context, an individual is an entity that can be 'seen' by natural selection or one that bears a fitness. A notion of individuality relying on autonomy will be at odds with parasitology, since parasites are typically defined as individuals that depend on other individuals for their survival. As shown by Osborne, the tension between the conception of biological individuals as autonomous entities and the notions of parasites played an important role in the development of parasitology in the late 19th early 20th century in France. In physiology, an individual is an entity able to maintain its integrity (the metabolic view). As shown by Landecker's chapter, this notion of individuality has been key in the development of physiology as a science. Finally, as shown in the chapters by Osborne, Gissis and Rieppel, discussions of the relationships between the parts and the whole of a biological individual played important roles in understanding human societies at different times. In his commentary, Scott Gilbert challenges all of these conceptions of individuality and argues for the holobiont, a host and its microbial symbionts, as the correct unit to consider as individual.

If there is no-one-size-fits all notion of biological individuality, why are we using the same term to refer to different objects of study? In his inspiring comment, James Elwick proposes that the notion of biological individuality is intuitively appealing because we have cognitive biases in its favor. He proposes that biological individuals are essentialised in three different ways: anatomically, physiologically, and developmentally. Individuals are spatially located, they perform a set of functions, and they have a 'plan' written in their DNA. I think Elwick is correct in his view that biological individuality is essentialised in the way he proposes, even by scientists. If this view is correct, it implies that when talking about biological individuality, one needs to distinguish at least two senses, namely biological individuals as ontological entities, and biological individuals as objects of studies. Each of these plays a very different role in theoretical development. This distinction is in some respects in line with the point made by Love and Brigandt that there is something to gain in switching from fundamental theorizing or metaphysics to epistemology in discussions about biological individuality. But my conclusion differs from that of Love and Brigandt. By recognizing the contexts and aims of scientists when they talk about biological individuality, Love and Brigandt argue, we can gain insights into the different possible conceptions of biological individuality and explain why one is chosen over another given a particular context. This leads them to argue for a pluralistic view of biological individuality, claiming that the fact "that there is more than one correct way to account for individuality means that there is more than one way to be an individual."

In my view, a more appropriate conclusion is not that there is more than one way to be an individual. Rather, it is that scientists have meant different things by this term in different disciplines at different points in time, as is clearly shown by Lidgard and Nyhart, and that these different meanings might have been driven by what scientists find intuitively appealing. It might also have led scientists to consider that individuals necessarily play a theoretical role in biology when, in fact, there have only been various uses of the term "individual" around which different scientific subfields have crystalized without clear or unitary ontological existence. That intuitions play a role in scientific practice is inevitable, but they can also mislead scientists in their quest to uncover the fundamental facts of the world. If the term 'individual' in one discipline refers to one kind of object and to another kind in another discipline, there is little ground for thinking that they both ought to play the same role in fundamental theorizing. Furthermore, if the former object is one that participates in a process, while the latter is one that is studied only in virtue of appealing to our intuitions, they should certainly be treated differently. This difference might partly vindicate a form of pluralism compatible with Love and Brigandt's point of view. In fact, like them, I believe it would be a mistake to approach individuality solely through fundamental theorizing. But it would be equally mistaken to argue that all conceptions of individuality are on par.

In the context of evolutionary theory, for instance, the distinction between individuals as independent objects of study appealing to our cognitive bias and individuals as entities playing a causal role in evolution has perhaps not been made clear enough. The Darwinian apparatus, in its most abstract forms, such as the Price equation, can be applied to any collection of entities that exhibit phenotypic variation whether or not they are what a scientist would recognize as biological individual. Thus, one may question the view that individuals play an important causal role in evolutionary theory. I am not claiming here that individuals do not play a significant role, just that the assumption that they do can be challenged. It is clear, however, that what we recognize as biological individuals are outcomes of evolutionary processes.

Providing an evolutionary explanation of individuality as an outcome of a process is a very different exercise from explaining the role of individuals in an evolutionary process. In the former case, individuals are in some sense dispensable from the theoretical apparatus, while in the latter case they are not. In theorizing about evolutionary transitions in individuality, one ought to make this distinction clear. In fact, the question of the way(s) in which evolution proceeds in producing entities we find reason to call 'individuals' at a higher level of organization is very different from the question of the process(es) by which natural selection shifts from one level to the other and 'sees' a new level of individuality that did not exist previously. Using the distinction between individuals as 'actors' and as 'outcomes' of a process represents another dimension through which we might approach the question of biological individuality, one I would argue has not been sufficiently considered.

To conclude, I found this collection a very enjoyable read and recommend it as a starting point to anyone interested in the notion of biological individuality broadly construed and interested in understanding what unifies and separates the different meanings of this term across time and disciplines. For someone interested in biological individuality from an evolutionary perspective solely, the approach that has stimulated the most philosophical discussions in recent years, this might not be the first book to read. Although the collection contains both chapters that are directly relevant to evolution and chapters that give some historical background on the notion of evolutionary individuality, evolution is not the focal point of the book.


Bouchard, Frédéric. 2008. “Causal Processes, Fitness, and the Differential Persistence of Lineages.” Philosophy of Science 75 (5):560–70.

Clarke, Ellen. 2010. “The Problem of Biological Individuality.” Biological Theory 5 (4):312–325.

———. 2013. “The Multiple Realizability of Biological Individuals.” The Journal of Philosophy 110 (8):413–435.

Pepper, John W., and Matthew D. Herron. 2008. “Does Biology Need an Organism Concept?” Biological Reviews 83 (4):621–27.