Biomedical Research and Beyond: Expanding the Ethics of Inquiry

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Christopher O. Tollefsen, Biomedical Research and Beyond: Expanding the Ethics of Inquiry, Routledge, 2008, 229pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415961165.

Reviewed by John McMillan, University of Hull


There are a number of things about this book that are admirable. Research ethics, like other areas within bioethics, has often taken its central task to be the articulation of generalizable norms that all can or should be able to agree upon. This isn't unreasonable if you think the central task is to provide robust normative guidance that is likely to be effective in a regulatory sense. For research ethics the Belmont principles are the classic example of this: they aim at expressing foundational moral requirements that are intended to be universal while also interpretable and applicable to particular moral rules and cases. In bioethics, the four principles of Beauchamp and Childress are intended to articulate a shared or common morality that doesn't rest upon a specific theoretical defence. This theoretical neutrality is supposed to provide those with fundamentally different commitments a shared normative framework. One of the downsides of a shared morality/principlist approach is that some debates cannot progress without reference to underlying theory for justificatory reasons, as well as for spelling out what the implications of a principle are for a specific moral issue. The first admirable feature of Tollefsen's book is that he unapologetically bases his claims about the ethics of research and inquiry in what he sees as the most plausible moral theory: a "basic goods" account. The basic idea is that there are a number of intrinsic goods that are applicable to the ethics of inquiry.

The second reason why this book goes beyond many other discussions of research ethics is its scope: many discussions of research ethics are informed by the Belmont principles of respect for persons, beneficence and justice, so a great deal of research ethics focuses upon the appropriate norms for protecting the interests of human research subjects. Clearly there is more to the ethics of research than this and Tollefsen's book is a bold attempt to broaden the scope of research ethics so as to provide a genuine ethic of inquiry. By focusing upon the goods that are internal to inquiry he attempts to build an account of the virtues that are relevant to research. In his final chapter Tollefsen arrives at the following virtues: justice, courage, temperateness, prudence, honesty, studiousness and integrity.

Of course the cost of grounding research ethics in a particular moral tradition is that those who have other theoretical commitments may not be convinced. In reaching the basic goods view Tollefsen puts to one side rival consequentialist and Aristotelian accounts. While it's not unreasonable to disagree with these moral theories and there are good reasons for supposing that the kind of account he generates is more easily justified by the basic goods view, his insistence that his account is incompatible with consequentialism and Aristotelianism (p. 6) risks unnecessarily limiting the number of people he might convince. After all, the chances of convincing consequentialists and Aristotelians about the errors of their ways in one chapter are slim. Given how interesting the project is, it's a shame, from a rhetorical point of view, to make the success of his claims about the ethics of inquiry contingent upon a specific moral theory.

It might also be that consequentialism can come closer to justifying Tollefsen's ethics of inquiry than he thinks. He claims that consequentialism "holds that all goods are commensurable with one another; that is, that there exists a common measure or standard by which the goods can be weighed, in their instantiations, next to one another." (p. 9) Strictly speaking, this isn't necessarily true. Consequentialism, at least in the sense that Elisabeth Anscombe originally intended, should be taken primarily as a claim about the consequences of actions being the only properties relevant to determining their rightness. There's no reason why consequentialists cannot also believe that goods are not aggregative or qualitatively comparatively. While it is the case that some early utilitarians like Bentham do think that goods are commensurable, many utilitarians think this is not straightforward: G. E. Moore being one prominent example. It might be that Tollefsen's claims are really about value as opposed to moral theory and arguing from this position might have convinced a greater number of those with different theoretical commitments.

A familiar problem for all intrinsic-good theories is determining which goods are valuable in themselves and why. Of course, specification and justification are the fundamental challenges for all value theories, but when we are asked to believe in a long list of goods and these are used for making judgments about whether or not particular forms of research are morally right, these worries become more acute.

In chapter five Tollefsen considers the ethics of embryonic stem cell research. The argument proceeds by explaining Eric Olson's animalist conception of personal identity and arguing that "a closer relationship obtains between the human animal and the human person" than Olson thinks (p. 69). The discussion proceeds to discuss the time at which embryos are individuated and an argument is mounted for the immorality of embryonic stem cell research. He claims

one's understanding of the nature -- the intrinsic nature -- of the fetus should lead one to conclude that as part of its normal development, it will grow into a being with psychological states. While not independent of other beings for its development, the fetus is self actualizing in ways that artefacts such as flags and statues are not, and its self-actualization leads to the having of certain sorts of psychological states. (p. 68)

He goes on to explain that if we evaluate the moral status of an embryo or a fetus at a specific point in time we fail to see the full temporal nature of the embryo or the fetus. He claims that this move enables him to distinguish between fetuses, embryos and animals which don't have the status of persons even if you take into account their temporal nature. It's hard to see why this isn't just another potentiality argument and so subject to the standard objections that make this view problematic, viz. why should the fact that an entity might go on to have morally significant properties at a later time entail that we should treat it as having those properties at an earlier point in time. As John Harris has pithily remarked, all human beings are potentially dead but it is absurd to attribute the moral status of the dead to the living. I suspect that the arguments of chapter five will not convince many who are not already sympathetic to Tollefsen's conclusions, but then it might be that he is primarily interested in fleshing out this position without expecting that all will be convinced.

In chapter six, where Tollefsen moves to discussing the use of animals in research, he quickly dismisses the attempts of Singer, Regan and Chappell to ground animal rights. Fundamentally, his objection seems to rest upon his commitment to the basic-good view "the goods that are reasons for human action are necessarily human goods that animals do not share. They therefore do not exist in the sorts of communion with us from which direct moral obligations flow." (p. 84) There is a consistent position here that draws upon his normative framework but it's not one that I find particularly convincing in this case. It doesn't seem unreasonable to believe that there are some intrinsic goods that tend to be instantiated only in human lives and relationships while also believing that the suffering of any animal is morally significant. Given that the basic-good view is liberal and includes a long list of goods, why insist that all goods must be uniquely human goods?

Biomedical Research and Beyond succeeds in broadening the scope of research ethics. Much of the discussion about research ethics is limited to the appropriate principles or rules that should govern what is done to research subjects both human and animal. Widening the focus of the debate so that the telos of research or inquiry as he describes it, emphasizes the fundamental ends of research, which are sometimes missing from debates about research ethics. In summary, this book has the potential to encourage a different way of viewing normativity and research. Even if one is not sympathetic to the basic-good view and some of his conclusions, it must be conceded that Tollefsen's book is a systematic approach that explains and unifies the ethics of inquiry.