Birth, Death, and Femininity: Philosophies of Embodiment

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Robin May Schott (ed.), Birth, Death, and Femininity: Philosophies of Embodiment, Indiana University Press, 2010, 267pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222374.

Reviewed by Ann V. Murphy, Fordham University


A suggestion from Robin May Schott's introduction to this volume proves essential when it comes to situating the four authors' analyses of birth and death. She suggests that the renewal of philosophical thinking on birth, death, and femininity at which the book aims is grounded in the idea of ambiguity. Honoring the idea that "conflict, and the related notions of ambiguity, ambivalence and paradox travel through reflections on birth and death," the authors aim to think existence between birth and death, and not to offer positive philosophies of birth or death in isolation (14). In Birth, Death, and Femininity, they analyze the work that the concepts of birth and death do across a number of philosophical genres and historical periods. Various concepts of birth and death have been philosophically deployed in ways both helpful and harmful, and it is a merit of this volume that the authors collectively embrace the ambiguity that resides there instead of forcing an artificial meta-narrative that would have failed to do justice to the varying ways in which concepts of birth and death are thought at different times and in different places. That the themes of ambiguity, paradox, and plurality would not yield clear and simple prescriptions when thought alongside such sweeping and important philosophical motifs as birth and death is no surprise. Schott notes this at the end of the introduction but also suggests that a serious consideration of the role that ambiguity and paradox play in philosophical discussions of birth and death nonetheless "may be the best path available". (20)

While the Western philosophical canon has evinced a certain fascination with the theme of death, "fewer philosophers have looked to the concept of birth in order to find a horizon of meaning or an inspiration for philosophical reflection" (1). Mortality has been afforded priority in the Western philosophical tradition. The essays in Birth, Death, and Femininity, however, do not attempt to redress this problem through a counter-argument in favor of the primacy of birth. Indeed, the authors of this volume collectively refuse this agenda. Instead, Schott describes their agenda as an attempt to "refocus attention on both the concept of natality and the concept of mortality in a shared frame of reference" (2). Hence the aim is not to outline a philosophy of birth or death, but to think through how the twin concepts of natality and mortality "contribute to reflections on fundamental questions in philosophy" (ibid.). The authors do a commendable job of honoring this ambiguous "life" of death and its duality in this regard, complicating the idea that death is wholly negative (8). Collectively, they present compelling analyses of an existence between birth and death.

The book is divided into four parts. The first section of the book, authored by Schott, focuses on issues of sexual violence in reference to the work of Simone de Beauvoir and Hannah Arendt. In her chapter on "Sexual Violence, Sacrifice, and Narratives of Political Origins," Schott examines the role that sexual violence plays in the formation of new political communities and the ways in which violations of the bodies of women can occur as transformative moments for certain communities (31). Schott looks to four narratives in which the founding of political community is grounded in sexual violence against women. Interested in the role of sacrifice in these interpretive narratives and the role of sexual difference in sacrificial logic, Schott outlines several constitutive features of sacrifice and links the sacrifice of women to the establishment of "a future, a republic, a united nation, a new people" (38). Toward the end of the chapter, Schott turns to difficult questions regarding the ubiquity of sexual violence during periods of political transformation. Do the ties that bind the logic of sacrifice to women's bodies indicate that violence, and indeed sexual violence, is requisite in the formation of political community? Schott does not definitively answer this question in the affirmative but asks that the reader take seriously the claim that women's bodies, by virtue of their ambiguous existence within and beyond community, never fully interior or exterior to the collectivity, are vulnerable to various kinds of violence whose aim is to shore up and circumscribe community borders. Given the current amplification of interest in genocidal rape, this chapter serves as a vital and careful exegesis of the ties that can bind sexual difference to violence in a communal, political imaginary.

In her second chapter, "Natality and Destruction: Arendtian Reflections on War Rape," Schott raises questions about the relationship between the body and the political "by focusing on the concept of birth and its transformation in sexualized violence" (51). Schott hints at connections that might be drawn between war rape and both radical and banal evil under Arendt's account, but these connections remain more suggestive than substantive. However, Schottt's aim in this chapter is not to apply Arendt's political philosophy to the phenomenon of war rape but the inverse. What sorts of reflections on Arendt's political philosophy do the realities of war rape generate? Which dimensions of Arendt's account of the relationship between the political body and the human body are called into question by war rape? Of particular interest to Schott is Arendt's conception of birth as carrying political meaning. By juxtaposing Giorgio Agamben's discussion of war rape with Arendt's, Schott argues that there is a specifically sexual dimension to this kind of violence -- and implications of this kind of violence for women's subjectivity -- that are not acknowledged in Agamben's biopolitical account. Through an examination of war rape in the former Yugoslavia, Schott hones resources from Arendt to think through the fundamental role of sexual difference in various manifestations of violence and even more specifically to think through the ways in which war rape renders birth a weapon of death (63). At the essay's end, Schott argues that the figures of dependency, temporality, memory, and newness that are implied in Arendt's theory of natality would apply to war rape as well, thus calling into question "Arendt's habit of using the concept of natality to emphasize the positive aspects of human existence, rather than negative possibilities" (64). This chapter productively emphasizes the existence between birth and death that is gestured toward in the introduction.

In section two, "Phenomenologies of Mortality and Generativity," Sara Heinämaa adopts a phenomenological perspective on birth and death, honing the philosophies of Beauvoir, Husserl, Heidegger, Levinas, and Kierkegaard to explore the relations among sexual difference, mortality, and temporality. Heinämaa's first chapter, "The Sexed Self and the Mortal Body," explores how Beauvoir's account of the living body builds upon Kierkegaard's existential reflections on the paradoxical structure of human existence. Heinämaa addresses the multitude of ambiguities at play in Kierkegaard's descriptions of life: he describes human existence as an ambiguous movement between finitude and infinitude, temporality and eternity, freedom and necessity, psyche and body (75). She then embarks on an illuminating exposition of the link between embodiment and finitude in the works of Kierkegaard, Beauvoir, Nietzsche, Husserl, and Heidegger. The last section of the chapter is the most provocative, with Heinämaa arguing persuasively in favor of the recognition that birth and death are not merely empirical, but transcendental figures, insofar as the phenomenological method reveals the transcendental self as temporal. By this Heinämaa does not mean that one's death is a transcendental issue for oneself, but rather that one's death assumes some significance as a "worldly event" that owes much of its significance to others (89). "I could not experience myself as a body among other similar bodies or my death as a worldly event among other events, unless I had other sensing and perceiving selves given to me in experience" (88).

In the next chapter Heinämaa considers Heidegger's idea of being-toward-death and its individuating function insofar as it distinguishes one's own possibilities from those of human life in general (99). Heinämaa's exposition of Heidegger's is particularly savvy, attentive to the renowned criticisms regarding Heidegger's failure to seriously address the significance of the death of the other, and attentive as well to those ways in which Heidegger's idea of being-towards-death might still provide useful insight into thinking the relationship between one's own death and the death of another. Heinämaa argues that in the epistemic order the other's death is primary (insofar as I witness the other's death but not my own), but it is one's own death that is most meaningful at the level of sense constitution, as it is the realization of my own mortality that informs the meaning I assign to existence. She also claims,

Death, not birth, is emblematic of this structural potentiality of lived time exactly because death concerns the one who lives-in-the-world. Death accents the radical and fundamental unexpectedness that belongs to lived time and, as a potentiality, to each of its moments (110).

For this reason, Heinämaa rejects a simple opposition between birth and death, preferring to think each in its singularity, but not as antitheses, or as the oppositional bookends of a life. In her final chapter, Heinämaa hones resources from Heidegger, Levinas, and Arendt to think about sexual difference and futurity, with particular attention paid to the nature of the relationship between the erotic and the paternal in Levinas, and to a comparison of the accounts of natality in Levinas and Arendt. Of Heinämaa's three chapters, this is the one that most substantively addresses issues of gender and sexual difference alongside the theme of natality. On the whole, Heinämaa's contributions to the volume are characteristically careful and illuminating accounts of what phenomenology can bring to bear in discussions of birth and death.

In the third section, "Nietzsche's Philosophy of Life," Sigridur Thorgeirsdottir analyses Nietzsche's philosophy of birth and brings the philosophies of natality in Nietzsche and Arendt into conversation. Noting the feminist criticisms of Nietzsche that understand his philosophy of birth and the body either to neglect or appropriate women's embodied experience, Thorgeirsdottir proceeds to give a reading of the natal self that aims to displace the caricature of Nietzsche as that philosopher who evinces an exaggerated investment in the notions of autonomy, domination, and self-sufficiency. By probing the possibility of "another Nietzsche" who is equally attentive to scenes of vulnerability and subordination, Thorgeirsdottir rejects the idea that the will to power concerns domination alone. Highlighting the relationality of Nietzsche's natal self, Thorgeirsdottir argues for a kind of opening to the other in birth that belies technical, instrumental or disembodied rationality. She notes that Nietzsche does not seek to replace a philosophy of death with birth but rather to understand the significance of birth and death as complementary concepts that reveal something about how we value life (167). Thorgeirsdottir then considers Nietzsche's philosophy as an attempt to overcome the metaphysical duality of life and death.

In her second chapter, "The Natal Self," Thorgeirsdottir continues to explore the idea of birth as an encounter, this time by placing Nietzsche in dialogue with Arendt. Noting Arendt's aversion to Nietzsche's notion of life, as it detracted from consideration of the public world of the political and consideration of what shape actions would take in that sphere, Thorgeirsdottir nonetheless notes what she takes to be two strong lines of influence when it comes to Nietzsche's influence on Arendt. First, as Arendt understands speech and action in the public sphere as a kind of "second birth," her account of birth is resonant with Nietzsche's understanding of becoming as creativity. Second, Thorgeirsdottir claims that Arendt's idea of natality as a kind of freedom has some affinity with Nietzsche's elaboration of the natal self. Thorgeirsdottir's account in this chapter is sympathetic to Nietzsche; she is invested in defending him against the Arendtian accusation that his concept of natality was individualistic, even solipsistic.

In the final chapter, "Antigone and the Deadly Desire for Sameness," Vigdis Songe-Møller outlines the relationship of the Platonic tradition and the Greek tragic tradition in relation to sexuality, birth, and death. She summarizes the difference between the Platonic and the tragic: "The optimistic character of Platonic philosophy is associated with the minimizing of the body; the life that the philosopher dreams of is beyond death, a life incorporeal. In the tragedies, people have bodies that are individual, sexualized, and mortal" (213). Songe-Møller claims that the significance of the sexed body is especially clear in death, in part because the way in which death occurs in tragedy tends to emphasize "bodies as either masculine or feminine" (213). In order to think through the question of whether or not the tragedies can be viewed as an alternative political discourse, she investigates the relationship between the city-state and the incestuous family as it is rendered in Antigone, drawing interesting parallels between Antigone's inclination toward unity and the philosophy of Parmenides, Empedocles' idea of love as a force that both creates and destroys, and Heraclitus' understanding of difference and strife as constitutive of the community.

One criticism I have of the book relates to the relative lack of a narrative that would render the volume more cohesive with regard to the various authors' projects. Arendt, Nietzsche, and Beauvoir are discussed by more than one author, but the ties that would bind these nine essays together in conversation might have been made more explicit. That said, and as I noted at the beginning of this review, each of the authors does address the idea that mortality and natality are figures that are frequently attended by ambiguity and paradox in philosophical writing, and this fact is enough to prevent a univocal narrative to which each of the authors would have subscribed. It is also the case that each of the essays thinks about the relationship between birth and death -- as promised in the introduction to the volume -- in a way that is refreshing in reference to much of what has been written on either of these philosophical motifs when they have been examined in isolation. Birth, Death, and Femininity will be of interest to scholars in feminist theory and to a wider audience of readers interested in philosophies of natality and mortality, and in philosophical engagements with temporality more broadly construed.