Bitter Knowledge: Learning Socratic Lessons of Disillusion and Renewal

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Thomas D. Eisele, Bitter Knowledge: Learning Socratic Lessons of Disillusion and Renewal, University of Notre Dame Press, 2009, 346pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268027742.

Reviewed by William Prior, Santa Clara University


This book is a personal meditation, an encounter with Socrates as a teacher, written by a law professor with his own classroom experience in mind. It is not a book primarily intended for an audience of scholars in Greek philosophy and should not be judged as such. It shows the influence of contemporary philosopher Stanley Cavell, whom the author quotes often. The book consists of a Preface, an Introduction, three chapters devoted to detailed readings of the Protagoras, Meno, and Theaetetus, a fourth chapter on the Apology, and an Epilogue. The purpose of the book is to exhibit a pattern, common to these dialogues, of disillusion and renewal (xiii). In Chapter I, "Introduction," the author rejects "two claims … commonly made about Socrates' performance in Plato's dialogues. The first is that Socrates' method of inquiry teaches only negative lessons … The second is that (especially in the earlier dialogues) Socrates' inquiries fail to reach any conclusions" (xiii). Rather, he states two lessons contained in these dialogues:

· You don't know what you think you know.

· You know more (or other) than what you think (you know). (15)

The first lesson is brought about by the Socratic elenchus and leads to disillusion, the "bitter knowledge" of the title (xvii). The second is the product of recollection (xiii, 17-18), the method whereby latent knowledge is recovered, according to the Meno. The author raises a related question concerning the Socrates who first disillusions, then renews his interlocutors: Is he a teacher?

Chapter Two of the book, "Who Can Teach Us? And What Can They Teach Us?" is devoted to the Protagoras. Much of the chapter is fairly conventional exposition of the dialogue, but interspersed with some rather unusual commentary. Though an account of the Protagoras that emphasizes the topics of the nature of virtue and whether it can be taught is faithful enough in its own way, Eisele writes, it "leaves out something essential":

The story that Socrates tells in the Protagoras is not a philosophical exercise in conceptual analysis concerning our understanding of aretê. It is, rather, a forceful rendering of Socrates' friendship for Hippocrates, whom he sincerely desires to protect from the consequences of his own foolishness. (45)

This comment differs from orthodox interpretations not only by elevating a fairly minor character, Hippocrates, to a leading role, but also by relegating to a secondary status the attempt to define virtue, which takes up the bulk of the dialogue.

When it comes to the character Protagoras, Eisele appears to desire to give him his due:

The power of Protagoras as a spellbinding speaker and arguer seems undeniable. Plato does not portray him as a buffoon or as easy prey for Socrates' dialectical questioning, nor does Socrates seem to underestimate Protagoras' virtuosity. In this long speech, I think it is fair to say that Plato shows Protagoras' performance to be arresting. (53)

Quite right; but at the same time Eisele criticizes Protagoras for refusing to enter fully into the argument with Socrates. Because he does not enter fully into the discussion, but uses speeches and the interpretation of poetry to evade as long as possible Socratic examination, he cannot benefit from the disillusion that typically follows from Socratic refutation. Hippocrates is a subject of disillusion and renewal, but Protagoras is not (79).

Chapter Three, "The Poverty of Socratic Questioning," concerns the Meno. Eisele distinguishes three types of student in the dialogue: Meno, his slave, and Anytus. "Meno wants to know, he wants to learn," writes Eisele (87). Anytus, on the other hand, "never shows himself to be open to Socrates' questions" (89). The slave, in contrast to both, "starts in a passive mode and then changes into an active learner" (90). Meno and the slave are each reduced to disillusion through Socrates' questioning, then renewed through the "therapy" (113) of recollection. As Eisele describes recollection, it is the "way we learn how to tie our opinions down, to anchor them in whatever knowledge we have inherited or accumulated from our parents, from others, from our language and our culture, from our own experience" (121). Despite the introduction of the doctrine of recollection into the Meno, however, Eisele regards the conclusion of the dialogue as "anticlimactic." The Socratic method, he writes, "even when used properly, does not guarantee satisfying answers… . This is the poverty of Socratic questioning" (122).

Chapter Four, "The Labor of Socratic Inquiry," is concerned with the Theaetetus. As in earlier chapters, the author deals with the two main interlocutors, Theaetetus and Theodorus. Theodorus is a reluctant contributor to the discussion; Eisele describes him as a kibitzer (148-9). He repeatedly begs off participating in the discussion, though he "actually gets caught up in the excitement of the hunt" (156) when Socrates finally forces him to join in. Ultimately, however, "Since Theodorus is not committed to these ideas or theories, he is not disillusioned by their refutation" (159). Theaetetus is another matter. Eisele remarks, "A teacher could not ask for a more willing student" (160), and "Courage and honesty and enthusiasm Theaetetus has in abundance" (162). And what of Socrates? He objects that Theodorus regards him, incorrectly, as a "bag of arguments," (181) but Eisele describes him (correctly, I think) as follows: "Given Socrates' familiarity with the matters being discussed … he has definite ideas to offer… . his mind is certainly not a tabula rasa. Rather, Socrates' mind is fully populated with a variety of ideas" (182). Though this description seems to me correct, it requires some discussion to reconcile it with Socrates' self-portrait as a barren midwife (Tht. 149a-151d). Socrates not only elicits not one but three accounts of knowledge from Theaetetus, he subjects them to fair, even friendly criticism. Though Theaetetus does not learn the nature of knowledge from Socrates, he does learn how to give an account. Both Theaetetus and Socrates are committed to the enterprise of giving an account of knowledge; presumably, both experience disillusion when Theaetetus' accounts fail.

The last dialogue Eisele turns to is the Apology, in Chapter Five, "Learning to Find Ourselves at a Loss." In this chapter he addresses two paradoxes: Socrates' denial that he is a teacher and his denial that he is wise (222). The expression of ignorance expresses the need for philosophical inquiry; and as for the denial that he is a teacher, Eisele quotes with approval Paul Woodruff:

Socrates is more teacher than he admits: he has firm beliefs himself about the rough outlines of knowledge and human virtue (his main subjects of inquiry) and he often questions people to bring them to see that they too must accept such beliefs, on pain of inconsistency with their deepest commitments. Socrates speaks humbly enough, but his aim is not modest: it is to transform people's lives by coaxing them into thinking as a philosopher thinks. (231)

And what of Socrates' disillusion? As the author notes, "he seems to find this experience to be invigorating" (233); hardly the response of most of his interlocutors. If disillusion is "bitter knowledge," Socrates does not seem to fit that description.

The final chapter of the book, "Epilogue: Realities of the Classroom," is Eisele's application of his treatment of the Socratic method to the law school classroom. As I noted at the outset, the author's intention is to reflect on the contemporary law school classroom from the perspective of the Socratic dialogue. Clearly, Eisele's understanding of himself as a teacher is inspired by his reading of the Platonic dialogues. I do not question the inspirational power of Socrates as a teacher. I do wonder, however, about the details of the applicability of the Socratic model of teaching to the law school classroom. Socrates never taught before a captive audience of students, he was not constrained by a syllabus or by the clock, he did not "prepare" for his encounters, he had no body of expert knowledge to impart, he did not ask questions to which he already knew the answers. "A teacher cannot just place his or her faith in classroom dynamics," Eisele writes, "or just wait for the intellectual sparks to fly" (240). But is not that just what Socrates appears to do in Plato's Socratic dialogues?

I am skeptical, too, about Eisele's claim, derived from his reading of Cavell, that Socrates was a practitioner of "ordinary language philosophy." Socrates was an essentialist about meaning, who regarded linguistic data as merely the "first draft" of philosophical discourse. He was also, pace Vlastos and many other interpreters, a metaphysician, certainly by the time we reach the Meno. The doctrine of recollection is not an account of how we derive latent knowledge from "experience," as Eisele would have it, but an account of how the immortal, endlessly reincarnated soul derives knowledge from a time when it was in a disincarnate state, including (in the Phaedo, if not explicitly in the Meno) knowledge of the Forms. (There is an empirical account of the acquisition of knowledge in the "aviary" model in the Theaetetus, but the author does not make use of it).

My main criticisms of Eisele's book concern two of its main features. I shall focus first on the author's main claim: that the dialogues contain a two-fold movement: first, disillusionment (the "bitter knowledge" of the title), and second, renewal. It seems to me that, of the dialogues the author selected for analysis, only the Meno really conforms to his pattern of disillusion and renewal. (A better choice than the Protagoras or Theaetetus might have been the Phaedo, which refers to the doctrine of recollection at 72e ff. The interlocutors are explicitly said to experience a moment of disillusion at 88c ff., before Socrates answers the objections of Simmias and Cebes.) Meno is explicitly disillusioned at 79e ff., where he compares Socrates to a numbing torpedo fish and where he utters his famous paradox: how is one to search for something if one doesn't in the least know what it is? Socrates offers Meno hope for renewal by introducing the doctrine of recollection (81a ff.); Eisele explicitly identifies recollection with renewal. Strictly speaking, though, only the examination of the slave-boy exhibits the pattern of disillusion and renewal, involving the doctrine of recollection. The Meno does end on a note of optimism, with the claim that right opinion is virtue, but (as in the Phaedo) it is the method of hypothesis, not the doctrine of recollection, that yields this conclusion.

As to the ending of the Protagoras, the promise of renewal is not to be found in recollection, but at most in Protagoras' prediction that Socrates might become famous for his wisdom (361e). As to disillusionment, it is something Protagoras might well feel when he is finally refuted by Socrates (360e); but he certainly masks it well in his gracious final remarks. In the case of the Theaetetus, Theaetetus is left barren of offspring by the Socratic elenchus, but is he disillusioned? Was he ever so committed to the definitions of knowledge he offers that he would regard their refutation as a demoralizing personal defeat? And where is the renewal? Socrates proposes a renewal of the discussion on the following day, as at the end of the Protagoras he had offered to continue the discussion immediately; but that is not the renewal the author has in mind.

I find a second aspect of the book problematic. The author writes,

I do not spend significant time examining or assessing the substantive arguments in which Socrates and his companions engage throughout these dialogues. Rather, I stay focused on the activities by means of which Socrates and these others inquire into the vexed issues that concern them. (xv)

This decision to eschew analysis of the arguments of these dialogues is, in my judgment, a serious flaw in the book, and one that has an effect on several other aspects of it. The author wants to defend portraits of Socrates' interlocutors as engaged or disengaged; but how can one do so without knowing whether they ought to be engaged, and how, with Socrates' attempts at refutation? How can one tell whether a negative conclusion to a dialogue is justified without evaluating the quality of the arguments that have led to it? As Gregory Vlastos said, "Almost everything Socrates says is wiry argument; that is the beauty of his talk for a philosopher" (quoted by Eisele, 214). What sense can one make of Socrates without discussing his arguments? To be specific, if Socrates is a teacher, his vehicle of instruction is argument; but how can we know the quality of his teaching without knowing the quality of his arguments? Again, Eisele criticizes Protagoras for being disengaged, but how can we evaluate Protagoras' resistance to Socrates' attempts to convince him that virtue is knowledge unless we study the quality of Socrates' arguments? Protagoras is, of all the interlocutors studied in this book, the one with the most developed philosophy of education. He has an account of the nature of moral education and an account of the nature of virtue. The conflict between Socrates and Protagoras is on much more of a nearly equal footing than is that between Socrates and the other interlocutors Eisele studies. It will not do, I think, to regard Protagoras as simply engaged or disengaged. By generally neglecting the analysis of the arguments of the dialogues, the author overlooks elements of more traditional interpretations.

In conclusion, I find the author's interpretation of the dialogues in terms of the twin movements of disillusion and renewal to be sound, but I think that only the Meno, of the dialogues he studies, exhibits that pattern. (On a broader scale, it could be argued that the dialogues as a whole exhibit the pattern of disillusion and renewal, with the elenctic dialogues exhibiting disillusion and the constructive dialogues, such as the Meno and Phaedo, showing how that disillusion is overcome with renewal.) Some of the descriptions of characters he offers are provocative, but they need to be supported by an analysis of the arguments they use, and those that are used against them, in the dialogues.