Bodies and Souls, or Spirited Bodies?

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Nancey Murphy, Bodies and Souls, or Spirited Bodies? Cambridge University Press, 2006, 154pp., $22.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521676762.

Reviewed by Lynne Rudder Baker, University of Massachusetts Amherst


Bodies and Souls, or Spirited Bodies? is a welcome book. Nancey Murphy defends a version of physicalism for Christians. She characterizes the physicalism that she endorses as the thesis that "we are our bodies -- there is no additional metaphysical element such as a mind or soul or spirit." Nevertheless, biology does not tell the whole story: We are "complex physical organisms, imbued with the legacy of thousands of years of culture, and, most importantly, blown by the Breath of God's Spirit; we are Spirited bodies." (ix) Murphy takes her main opponent to be a soul- or mind-body dualist.

The book appears in Current Issues in Theology, a series of short and focused theological studies, aimed at students, Christian teachers and church professionals. As her title suggests, Murphy's book is on the nature of human persons. With no pretense to being scholarly with respect to early church history or biblical studies, the book presents brief and accessible summaries of views on the soul, on resurrection, and on the impact of science on Christian conceptions of human persons. Murphy is careful to point out that oversimplifications are inevitable in a brief and accessible book. Although a serious student of theology will want to dig deeper, this book is a good place to start.

There are four chapters. Chapter One explores Biblical and theological perspectives on human nature. Chapter Two discusses what physics, evolutionary biology and neuroscience say about human nature. Chapter Three argues against reductionism, and defends free will and morality. Chapter Four takes up human distinctiveness, divine action and personal identity as challenges to physicalism. Although I found many of the arguments difficult to follow in detail, I shall try to summarize the main points.

In Chapter One, Murphy convincingly shows that there is no such thing as "the" anthropology of the Bible or of the Christian tradition. Murphy argues that the fact that the Bible seems to teach dualism is largely a result of poor translations. Once the translations are repaired, "it is hard to find any clear teaching on the metaphysical make-up of the person" in the Bible at all. (p. 37) The Biblical authors were "interested in the various dimensions of human life, in relationships, not in the philosophical question of how many parts are essential components of a human being." (p. 39) Thus, the door is open to physicalism.

What difference can or should physicalism make to theology? Murphy makes some brief suggestions about theological issues like the doctrine of God, Christology and Trinity, Salvation and History, and about the unfortunate effects of dualism. The adoption of physicalism may lend Christian spirituality renewed emphases on the significance of the body, and on the reign of God, in which followers of Jesus participate by active love of neighbor and in struggle for justice and peace. These are interesting ideas, worth pursuing at greater depth than is possible in a book of this compass.

Chapter Two hammers more nails into the coffin of dualism. Murphy sees three periods of re-appraisal of human nature prompted by science: the replacement of Aristotelian physics by modern atomistic physics, the Darwinian revolution, and recent developments in the neurosciences.

Murphy begins with a brief discussion of how the atomist revolution undercut the medieval Christian world-view by calling into question the Aristotelian and Thomistic idea of the soul as the form of the body. There seemed two options: Hobbes' physicalism, and Descartes' "return to a radical dualism of mind (or soul) and body." (p. 45) In the face of modern physics, mind-body dualism has seemed implausible: How could an immaterial mind cause a body to move?

The Darwinian revolution highlighted the continuity between human beings and other higher animals. The transitions between species were too gradual to suppose that humans have souls but other animals do not. Murphy points to the theological roots of social Darwinism. Paley set the stage by arguing that whatever the character of the natural order, it was designed by God. Then, Malthus (an Anglican clergyman) explained that the character of the natural order was "competition and starvation" -- which then can be seen as providential. (p. 53)

The cognitive neurosciences give reason to think that all the human capacities attributed to the soul can be understood as "processes involving the brain, the rest of the nervous system and other bodily systems, all interacting with the socio-cultural world." (p. 56) Interestingly, a number of views of Thomas Aquinas (e.g., his recognition of vis aestimativa, or an estimative power) find echoes in neuroscience (e.g., the discovery of the role of the amygdala in responding to intentions of others).

Chapter Three is a defense of nonreductive physicalism. In particular, Murphy aims to show how nonreductive physicalism allows us to have free will and moral responsibility. Her strategy has two prongs. First, she argues against reductionism and for downward causation. Second, she argues that human beings are "highly self-directed organisms whose behavior exerts downward causal control over their neural systems," and that they can come to "govern their own behavior on the basis of moral reasons." (p. 73)

Murphy construes reductionism as the two-fold thesis that all entities are (nothing but) arrangements of atoms and that the behavior of an entity is determined by the behavior of its parts. She takes reductionism to imply that all causation is micro-causation. This allows her to argue against reductionism by examples of "holistic" properties (like shape) that are causally efficacious. I do not believe that reductionists would be convinced. They agree that shape is causally efficacious and is a property of a whole entity, but they also believe that the shape of the whole entity is determined by the shapes and arrangement of the parts. (See, e.g., Jaegwon Kim.)

Murphy defends downward causation. She does not set out her defense straightforwardly as an argument; so what follows is my best reconstruction. (pp. 78-84) First, Murphy distinguishes laws from initial or boundary conditions; then she argues that boundary conditions are themselves determined top-down. Often, the boundary conditions (structural and environmental) exert downward causal efficacy by means of "selection of lower-level entities or causal processes according to the way they fit into higher-level causal patterns." (p. 90) The laws of a system of higher-level organization, where natural selection operates, are not reducible to laws of physics. "The patterns of boundary conditions picked out by the special sciences have downward causal efficacy in that they can affect which causal powers of their constituents are activated or likely to be activated." (p. 83) So, she concludes, higher-level processes can influence lower-level processes, including brain processes. (p. 97)

The self-directedness needed for moral responsibility begins to emerge when an organism can use information from its environment to redirect its activity. (p. 86) Finally, more complex creatures are capable of "self-transcendence" -- the "ability to represent to oneself aspects of one's own cognitive processes in order to be able to evaluate them." (p.89) Self-transcendence, along with language, provides the means of escaping biological determinism. (p. 91)

Murphy then turns to free will and moral responsibility (the reason that we care about free will). She sets aside challenges to moral responsibility from God's foreknowledge, predestination, and social determinism on the grounds that "the issue at stake for the physicalist is neurobiological determinism." (p. 103) Her aim is to show that moral responsibility is compatible with what we know about neuroscience and cognition.

One of the capacities needed for moral responsibility is the ability to evaluate one's desires. Murphy comments that "cognitive processes need to be understood in terms of hierarchical levels of processing such that higher cognitive levels influence lower levels, for example, by means of attention, expectancy, intention -- and thus lower-level brain processes." (p. 97) She says that if she has made the case for downward causation via selection, "it makes no difference whether the laws of the bottom level are deterministic or not; higher-level selective processes can operate equally well on a range of possibilities that have been produced (at the lower-level) by either random or deterministic processes." (pp. 106-7, her emphasis) This claim seems to miss the point. Higher-level selective causal processes may themselves be deterministic; indeed, there is no reason to think that selective processes are not deterministic.

In fact, Murphy may well agree. Her characterization of free will is a compatibilist one: "[W]hen a person acts on the basis of considered goals and principles, without undue biological or social interference, she has become the author of her own acts and ought to be described as acting freely." (p. 108) She explicitly argues against the idea of free will as "total autonomy". This makes me wonder why she thinks that neurobiological determinism is a threat to moral responsibility at all.

Chapter Four takes up four issues: (i) What reason is there to think that physicalism is true? (ii) If human beings are just organisms (without souls), then in what way are human beings distinctive? (iii) How does God act in the physical world? (iv) In what does personal identity consist?

Murphy's response to (i) is that there is scientific support for physicalism, but not for dualism. Re (ii) Murphy argues that human beings are distinctive in being able to carry out moral duties, and to do so because they are moral duties. Also, we (sans souls) have the ability to have a relationship with God. As to (iii), Murphy suggests that God acts in the world at the quantum level, where there is no conflict with natural causation. Indeed, Murphy says, "It is possible from a theistic perspective to interpret current physics as saying that the natural world is intrinsically incomplete and open to divine action at its most basic level." (p.131)

Regarding (iv), Murphy's account of personal identity is that it "is not the body qua material object that constitutes our identities, but rather the higher capacities that it enables: consciousness and memory, moral character, interpersonal relations, and, especially, relationship with God." (p. 132) Taking consciousness to be an "integration of various aspects of memory and awareness," Murphy proposes a combined "body-memory-consciousness criterion" of personal identity. (p. 136-7) Then she adds what might be called 'moral character' to the criterion. Finally, she drops any requirement of spatio-temporal continuity for the persistence of a body. This allows that there can be a temporal interval between "decay of the earthly body and what is then essentially the recreation of a new body out of different 'stuff'." (p. 142)

Thus, in a very short span, Murphy uncovers many deep and important issues that face Christians today. Now I'd like to raise two questions about Murphy's project.

(1) To what extent are we purely biological beings? Murphy's emphasis on neurobiology suggests that we are purely biological beings; but her view that we are "complex physical organisms, imbued with the legacy of thousands of years of culture, and … blown by the Breath of God's Spirit" (ix) suggests that biology deals with only part of what we are.

There is a related logical question about the place of the body in Murphy's view. Murphy has a complex criterion of personal identity: a "combined body-memory-consciousness" plus moral character. (pp. 137-8) However, she also takes the body to be "the substrate for all of the personal attributes", and she says that "there is no reason in principle why a body that is numerically distinct but similar in all relevant respects could not support the same personal characteristics." (p. 141, my emphases) She goes on to allow for "essentially the recreation of a new body out of different 'stuff'." (p. 142) Is having this very body a necessary condition for being me or not?

On the one hand, if body is part of the criterion of personal identity, then having this very body is a necessary condition for being me. On the other hand, if I could have a body that is numerically distinct from this body, then having this very body is not a necessary condition for being me. So, Murphy cannot have it both ways. (Murphy's appeal to Wiggins does not mitigate this dilemma. In the first place, Murphy does not distinguish the sortal dependency of individuation, which Wiggins endorses, from the relativity of identity, which he adamantly opposes. (see p. 133) In the second place, the dilemma pops up no matter how 'same body' is construed.)

(2) Exactly what philosophical role does Murphy see for neurobiology? She suggests, for example, that "one ask whether the theories of, say, Plato or Aristotle are better supported than contemporary neuroscientific theories about the sources of our capacities for cognition, emotion, and all of the other faculties that earlier theorists had attributed to the soul or mind." (p. 115) Surely Plato and Aristotle were not trying to do what neuroscience does better. Neuroscience looks for mechanisms that subserve the phenomena (like evaluating one's reasons) that Murphy discusses. But we should not conflate the mechanisms with the phenomena that they subserve. Plato and Aristotle were concerned with the philosophically interesting phenomena, not the mechanisms that subserve them.

Murphy says: "Neuroscience now contributes to our understanding of both morality and religious experience." (p. 66) She cites the famous case of Phineas Gage, the 19th century workman whose brain was run through by a metal rod. Although it is interesting that brain damage to specific areas of the brain results in certain moral deficits, I do not see how this information helps us to understand morality any better than we already did. Similarly, I do not see how the fact that specific parts of the brain are activated during meditation and prayer helps us understand religious experience. (pp. 67-8)

On a number of points, I think that Murphy is exactly right: (1) there is no single teaching about the metaphysics of human beings in the Bible or in Christian tradition, (2) some nonreductive version of physicalistic anthropology is compatible with Christianity, (3) the grounds for believing in souls have been undercut by the sciences, (4) we are still morally responsible, (5) libertarian free will is incoherent; (6) the free will problem has been badly framed; (7) brain imaging will not "provide evidence for or against the existence and action of God" (p. 69), (8) higher-level entities exist in their own right. But defending this package of theses requires more careful attention than was always apparent in the book. For example, on p. 74, Murphy says flatly that "the laws of nature are deterministic." Then, with no qualification of that statement, she says on p. 131 that the laws of quantum mechanics are only statistical. No doubt, she was referring to different (irreducible) levels, but she should have made this explicit.

It is perhaps inevitable that a book of this sort will skim across the surface of many deep issues. Still, Bodies and Souls, or Spirited Bodies? is written in a comfortable conversational style and introduces many of the controversies that confront Christians today. It will be successful if, as I expect, it whets readers' appetites for more.