Bodies of Resistance: New Phenomenologies of Politics, Agency, and Culture

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Doyle, Laura, ed., Bodies of Resistance: New Phenomenologies of Politics, Agency, and Culture, Northwestern University Press, 2001, xxxiv + 305 pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-8101-1847-5.

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


Bodies of Resistance is a collection of ten essays on embodiment and its various forms of resistance to disciplinary regimes, plus a lengthy introduction by the editor, Laura Doyle. The essays are paired and divided into five sections, each with its own brief introduction, which tends to make the book seem more like a patchwork than a unified whole; nevertheless, Doyle insists on its cohesion. Most of the ten authors, she says, are engaged in what she calls “postmodern phenomenology” (xiii). (The final essay, “The Dimensions of History: Colonial Mapping, Architecture, and the Perils of ‘Constructive Phenomenology’” by Daniel Bertrand Monk, is a critique of this approach, but, as such, is still very much engaged with it.) The collection’s purpose, according to Doyle, is to address this question: “If as bodied social creatures we walk always within the contours of a culture, shaped by its codes and disciplines, how do we realize in the flesh any gesture of resistance? If prohibitions insinuate themselves into our most intimate and palpable forms of being, the sensations of our hands, the sights of our eyes, out of what materials, by what moves, might we (do we) generate another social ontology and write an alternative code?” (xi). The essays typically address this question by way of a phenomenological analysis of embodiment, drawing largely on the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty and, to a lesser extent, Jacques Lacan.

The collection contains a number of very interesting pieces. (In addition to Monk and Doyle herself, contributors include: Jacob Rogozinski, Claudia Brodsky Lacour, Judith Butler, Bracha Lichtenberg Ettinger, Beate Allert, Janis Greve, Kevin Gaines, and Cheryl Herr.) Because of the constraints of space, only three essays will be highlighted here.

First, Judith Butler’s “Sexual Differences as a Question of Ethics: Alterities of the Flesh in Irigaray and Merleau-Ponty” is a wonderfully clear and helpful explication and critique of Luce Irigaray’s An Ethics of Sexual Difference. Butler begins by noting Irigaray’s almost self-effacing foregrounding of the male philosophers whose work she reads in An Ethics of Sexual Difference; “…one might at first glance conclude that by virtue of these profuse citations, Irigaray seeks to make herself accountable to the texts that she reads…” (59). Alternatively, given the tone she sometimes strikes, one might hear Irigaray’s work as a kind of mocking or parody. Butler, however, offers a third interpretive suggestion, namely, that Irigaray “enacts an ambivalent relation to the power attributed to these texts, a power that she at once attributes to them but also seeks to undo” (60). And, further,

What is perhaps most paradoxical and enigmatic about her textual entanglement with these texts, and with Merleau-Ponty’s in particular, is that it enacts and allegorizes the kind of entanglement—or intertwining—that characterizes relations of flesh. In this sense, then, the text enacts the theory of flesh that it also interrogates… (60).

Irigaray insists that ethical relation is effected, basically, by the question, “Who are you?” With this question, what she calls the closed circuit of the subject is broken; the subject does not attempt to assimilate the other’s experience to its own, to exchange or substitute itself for the other, but rather to attend the other in his/her otherness. Irigaray accuses Merleau-Ponty of failing to do this in his theory of the flesh. As Butler states it:

The argument Irigaray makes against Merleau-Ponty proceeds in the following way: to claim, as he does, that the relation of touch or sight is reversible is to claim that the one who touches can be touched, the one who sees can be seen, and that the subject and object poles of these experiences are bound together by a connective “flesh of things.” This reversibility presupposes the substitutability of the subject pole with the object pole, and this substitutability, she argues, establishes the identity of both touched [sic] and touched, seer and seen” (71-72).

However, Butler points out, Irigaray’s feminist text itself, by miming Merleau-Ponty’s allegedly masculinist text throughout, is in a sense incorporating his text in her own. Thus her text destabilizes the claim she makes in it that the feminine is radically other to the masculine. Rather, feminine and masculine seem to be fully intertwined, interdependent. “For what emerges between Irigaray and Merleau-Ponty is not ‘difference’ per se, but a founding implication in the Other, a primary complicity with the Other without which no subject, no author, can emerge” (68). Hence, Butler asserts, a more important and more basic ethical question to be raised and addressed is: “how to treat the Other well when the Other is never fully Other, when one’s own separateness is a function of one’s dependency on the Other, when the difference between the Other and myself is, from the start, equivocal” (68).

Butler goes on to argue that for Merleau-Ponty reversibility does not equal identity, and Irigaray can only hold that it does by holding onto her psychoanalytic assumption that the substratum that allows reversibility is the repressed maternal body. Why make this assumption, though, Butler asks. Why not leave the issue as Merleau-Ponty does, with the substratum of the flesh simply unidentifiable? Butler ends her essay by asserting that even in symmetrical relations—where substitutability might be more appropriate—there is still always a possibility of excess; the so-called circuit need not be understood as closed. She writes, “For the hand that touches is not identical to the hand that is touched, even if it is the same hand, and this noncoincidence is a function of the temporally noncoincident ontology of the flesh” (76). Flesh, in its noncoincidence, is open to and even pervaded by otherness. Indeed, Butler suggests, this openness is what makes Irigaray’s intertwining in An Ethics of Sexual Difference possible in the first place.

Laura Doyle’s essay “Bodies Inside/Out: A Phenomenology of the Terrorized Body in Prison” draws extensively on narratives composed by political prisoners in Romania and Argentina. As might be expected, her essay more directly than Butler’s addresses the issue she poses in her editor’s introduction to the volume. She is primarily interested in how prisoners held for years in solitary confinement, often tortured, and subjected to incessant harassment and violation develop strategies to sustain themselves, many of which involve bodily movement and functions. Her premise is that in such extreme circumstances what Merleau-Ponty calls the intercorporeality of bodies allows for the possibility of destabilization or reversal in power relations. As Doyle puts it,

…the condition of chiasmatic slippage and possibility, which is space within surface, emerges as subject to no law of mere force. Here, perhaps, is where resistance lives. … In giving place to the dialectical chiasm within a body and between bodies, in its ontology as an opening and a hiddenness, this space both allows and eludes access. It holds the possibility of defiance and duplicity—of sur vival, of evasion of invasion (81).

Doyle pays close attention to the ways in which prisoners live through each other and things in their intensely confined spaces. For example, Lena Constante engages in handiwork, making puppets out of any kind of stray object or material overlooked by the guards, and she hides them in the folds of her cell. Gradually, also, she learns to use the reverberating walls of her cell as a sounding board through which to communicate with other prisoners. In a sense, the cell, with its opennesses and enclosures, is engaged as intercorporeal, her body folded in a kind of continuity with its materiality. Thus the body’s noncoincidence with itself in its flesh leaves open the possibility of intercorporeality with the other, whether other human or other manner of materiality. Constante’s narrative itself and others like it, Doyle concludes, enacts a similar kind of opening out toward the reader. In making the reader witness to the event of their corporeal extremity, these imprisoned narrators implicate and engage the reader bodily, and thus, Doyle asserts, “they leave us [as readers] thrown open and called out” (98).

Janis Greve’s essay “Legal Bodies, Racial Bodies: Autobiography and Autonomy in Patricia Williams’s Alchemy of Race and Rights” is an interesting analysis of the ways in which Patricia Williams’ text enacts a movement of resistance by thrusting forth a body (or bodies) that it also repeatedly withdraws or loses. This oscillation is a result, Greve suggests, of an impossibility that lies at the heart of Williams’ project.

Alchemy seeks to reclaim the private, autonomous body from ideological or, more narrowly in this case, legal confiscation. And yet insofar as all bodies are not only autonomous but also interdependent—in Merleau-Ponty’s sense of being intertwined socially and ontologically with other bodies—Williams’s project strategically performs the tension between the necessity and the impossibility of this reclamation of the body (196).

Williams reports that she has identified the bill of sale that gave ownership of her great-great grandmother, then a young girl, to the white man who became her great-great-grandfather. This bill of sale is the only record of her grandmother available, probably the only documentation of her existence extant, so Williams finds she must seek “the missing shape of her grandmother” (200) by studying the young girl’s master and rapist. The grandmother herself cannot be represented, cannot strictly speaking be identified historically, except by this most indirect route, by attention to omissions, absences, silences, gaps; she appears only as an emptiness outlined by her white oppressor and the law that supports and identifies him.

This state of affairs is emblematic, Greve believes, of Williams’ own predicament as a black writer, teacher, and lawyer. She is able to appear, present and represent herself, only as racialized and racist discourses (including that of the law) permit. She wants to claim herself, bodily, as a black woman, but she attempts to do so through a discursive apparatus—made up primarily of technically accurate description, material evidence, legal documentation, and classically liberal rational argument—that has never allowed African-Americans any sort of autonomous self-representation. And Williams knows this. “Williams documents carefully how her right to use her experience as evidence, to act as her own primary resource in the world, is a human privilege consistently denied herself and other black subjects” (205). Persistently offering self-descriptions and snippets of autobiography, Williams endeavors to overcome the racist limitations of the discourse she finds herself in and employs, but at the same time she is aware that offering herself in this way risks racist readings that once again obscure her.

Thus, Williams’s essays formulate questions which crucially describe a racially inflected autobiographical impasse between writing and “being read”: Exactly how does she prevent her readers from verifying her experience in the world as a black female subject, when verification is the very thing she seeks to claim for herself—the basic human right to speak from one’s own experience and be heard? How does her book not become reduced to another “official” document erasing her credibility as a speaker in the same manner as birth certificates and teacher evaluations confining her in categories and prescriptions phrased upon her civic exclusion? Just as it is impossible to release the ancestral body of her great-great-grandmother from the bill of sale that controlled it, her book—if placed in the wrong hands—could become another bill of sale, a text identifying her according to propertizing speculations about the “worth,” heft, and utility of Patricia Williams (210).

Greve concludes with the assertion that an unclaimable, absent body circulates through Williams’ text. “This absence is produced by the author’s desire to escape the embodying gazes of her audience, and the writing that would enable such concretizations in spite of its own attempts to ‘own’ itself and realize the bodily groundings of its author” (211). Thus, Greve maintains, Williams’ effort in at least one sense fails; her text is never able to present the autonomous and embodied black woman it seeks so vigorously to bring into the courtroom and stand before the judge.

The other seven essays in Bodies of Resistance are as provocative and varied as the three highlighted here. They investigate social contract theory, Goethe’s writings on color, black diaspora music, phenomenology’s applicability to crosscultural studies, and many other important issues. The book as a whole is rich and thoughtful. Nevertheless, it does not really answer Doyle’s initial question, nor is it even clear that most of the authors really attempt or even desire an answer.

Doyle’s question—if we are constituted by existing power networks, how do we ever resist those networks?—no doubt does not admit of one single answer. Perhaps there are as many answers as there are instances of resistance, reversal, or departure from norms, traditions, and regimes. But it is equally likely that the question itself is flawed and therefore simply unanswerable.

Norms, traditions, and regimes are neither monolithic nor static. They are plural; they can be internally inconsistent and self-violating. That very often human beings find themselves, bodily, in the throes of such self-violating and self-overcoming institutions, disciplinary practices, and systems of belief is no surprise. We do not need a theory of the flesh to account for what we do and how we think and feel within those self-overcoming movements. What is perhaps most important about Merleau-Ponty’s work in this context is his insistence on openness, temporality, noncoincidence, and non-identity. We can resist and oppose and change ourselves and our world not because, as good theorists would have it, there is something that is true about human being and flesh, but, on the contrary, because there is always something not-true, “something” in excess to truth and all its categories and stabilities. If there can be no answer to Doyle’s question, it is because answers occur within the domain of the true, and resistances, singular events, and becomings of every sort occur radically elsewhere.