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Marenbon, Jon, Boethius, Oxford, 2003, 266pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195134079.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hause, Creighton University


It is easy to see why we find little secondary literature on Boethius’s work as a whole. The Boethius of the commentaries seems to be an Aristotelian; the Boethius of the theological treatises seems to be a neoplatonic Christian theologian; and the Boethius of the Consolation seems to be a neoplatonic philosopher. How can one write a single monograph on works so diverse by so apparently protean an author? Moreover, many scholars find Boethius’s most original work muddled, and his solid and interesting work unoriginal.

If all this were correct, we could expect a book on the Boethian corpus to be a mere collection of essays and not a unified work; that some of the essays would contain little worth reading, since they would be on muddled and unoriginal texts; and moreover, that some would be of interest only to literature scholars, others only to philosophers and still others only to theologians. John Marenbon’s Boethius is most decidedly not like this, and that is not just to Marenbon’s credit of course, but to Boethius’s as well. Marenbon’s discussions of Boethius’s varied works is unified by the common threads he finds connecting works in the Boethian corpus. In addition, he argues persuasively that the Consolation and theological treatises are truly great philosophical works.

The Logical Works

As Marenbon points out himself, there is not much that is original in Boethius’s logical works, yet they are worth study both for their extraordinary influence on medieval thinkers before the recovery of Aristotle and for the insight they afford into the method and content of Boethius’s truly original, great works, the Opuscula sacra and the Consolation of Philosophy. The selection from the commentaries Marenbon treats in greatest detail is the famous discussion of universals in the Second Commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge. All later mediaeval authors took this as their point of departure in treating universals, and the way Boethius characterizes the issue colors all subsequent medieval treatments. For this reason, and because Marenbon devotes more time and attention to this text than to any other in Boethius’s logical works, and because Marenbon’s interpretations are themselves perplexing in some respects, it is worth a closer investigation.

Boethius argues that there are no universals in extramental reality (27):

  1. Everything that really exists is one in number.
  2. Nothing that is common to many at the same time can be one in number.
  3. Genera and species are common to many at the same time.
  4. Therefore, genera and species do not really exist.

Since the argument is valid, and Boethius seems to take (2) and (3) as analytically true, that leaves only (1) open for criticism. But Marenbon’s only defense of (1) is that it “is a fundamental principle accepted by Boethius and many other philosophers” (27). However, “fundamental” does not imply inarguable, and acceptance by “many” other philosophers gives us a reason not to dismiss it, but not necessarily to accept it. Not all philosophers accept (1) (and, most tellingly for Boethius, not all neoplatonist philosophers accept it).

This argument’s conclusion generates an epistemological worry. Since we attempt to understand reality by classifying beings under genera and species, if there are no genera or species, our attempts are all failures. We in fact know nothing, since our ideas of genera and species are simply figments. To resolve this problem, Boethius explains that the process by which we arrive at our ideas of genera and species is not falsifying, but truth preserving. However, as commentators have often noted, Boethius’s solution is vague. Marenbon, accordingly, offers a detailed account of the solution, dividing it into three stages.

In forming ideas of genera and species, we first use mathematical abstraction. By division, we see the incorporeal nature in itself without the body that nature is fixed in. Next, we use inductive abstraction. Considering the numerically many singulars in which species are, the mind collects their likeness. The resulting thought is a species. Third, Boethius adds this thought: The objects under discussion are both singular and universal; when such an object is “perceived sensibly in those things in which it has being” (30), it is singular; when considered in thought, it is universal.

This solution is supposed to dispel our epistemological worries, but it is quite vague. Is Boethius advocating realist abstractionism or constructivism? Unfortunately, Marenbon does not characterize constructivism as clearly as he might. What he says is that on a realist view, what the mind grasps are really existing objects; while on a constructivist view, the contents of one’s thoughts do not correspond “directly” (28) or “straightforwardly” (30) to any one thing. What this means, I take it, is that if the relation between the object of thought and one’s thought contents falls short of formal identity, this implies constructivism. If this is right, then if one’s thought contents have different properties from the properties of the object one is grasping, or if one’s thought contents are not isomorphic with the object, then one’s thoughts are constructs. However, if this is what Marenbon means by constructivism, then inductive abstraction is quite compatible with realism. This stage of the process of forming ideas might simply be a means of correctly identifying the species or genera. If one’s only experience of human beings was Socrates, it would take meeting Euthyphro to show that “human being” is not defined as “wise and rational animal.”

Marenbon, in his first of two interpretations, thinks there is some reason to view Boethius as a realist abstractionist, for he seems to be claiming (the text is a little vague) that the likeness that various singular things bear to one another (what some other thinkers call their “nature,” though Boethius does not use this word) is both singular and universal: singular in extramental reality and universal when grasped in thought. When we abstract them from bodies, then, we are discovering things that really exist. And in fact, Boethius goes on to say that “genera and species subsist in one way, but are grasped by the intellect in another way.” But if the intellect grasps them as universals, then is this not constructivism? Marenbon does not offer any answer, but perhaps his idea is that because universality and singularity are not parts of the nature, the universality of one’s thoughts does not count against identity with the object.

However, Marenbon offers a second interpretation, inspired by what he calls the Modes of Cognition Principle. According to this principle, which plays an important role in the Consolation’s discussion of divine foreknowledge and human freedom, the way a cognitive power cognizes something is determined by the nature of that power, not by the thing cognized. Reason, because of its nature, will grasp things through universals. According to Marenbon, if in fact Boethius is relying on this principle, then the view he presents will be a sort of constructivism, but one that makes a bow to realist abstractionism. But it is difficult to see why Marenbon reaches this conclusion. First, why does the introduction of the Modes of Cognition Principle make this view more constructivist than the view presented in the first interpretation? Perhaps, on this second interpretation, genera and species—or perhaps we should say the natures identical to them—do not exist in reality, even as particulars. But that would be hard to reconcile with Boethius’s claim that they “subsist in sensible things.” And if the Modes of Cognition Principle simply tells us that reason will grasp these genera and species as universals, then this view will be constructivist only to the extent that this implies a lack of identity between the contents of one’s cognition and the extramental object of one’s cognition. But this principle does not introduce any barrier that was not considered in the first interpretation, and so if the first one could count as realist abstractionism, I do not see why the introduction of the Modes of Cognition Principle would make any difference.

Opuscula Sacra

Despite their wide variety of subject matter, the Opuscula were originally published together and, Marenbon argues, form a unit. OS IV, On the Catholic Faith, sets out problems the rest will discuss. Each of OS I-III concerns a problem about predication involving God (and creatures as well, in OS III). And OS I, II, III, and V share a common method: Boethius appeals to Aristotelian philosophy, in particular logic, to expose flaws in his opponents’ views, and uses the same philosophy to construct less assailable views. However, in the spirit of his neoplatonic predecessors, Boethius does not think that Aristotelian logic can be applied to God in the same way it can be applied to creatures; at some point the logical apparatus will simply break down. Still, he thinks it can it can provide us with “an analogy to guide us in our understanding” (76). Boethius’s ideas about the relationship between faith and reason are implicit here. If logical incoherence shows a theological position is unacceptable, then Boethius sides with Origen against Tertullian in thinking faith and reason cannot conflict.

Marenbon shows this methodology at work in OS V, which argues for an orthodox Christology against the heresies of Nestorius and Eutyches. Nestorius argued that because Christ has two natures he must be two persons. Eutyches, in contrast argued that because Christ is only one person, he must have only one nature. Boethius’s goal is to explain how a single person can have two natures. In a move whose cleverness Marenbon makes apparent later, Boethius picks this Aristotelian definition from among several candidates: “Nature is the specific differentia which informs a thing” (70, citing OS V 1.111-112). On the Porphyrian tree, a schema of universals on which a highest genus is divided and subdivided until the lowest species are found, it is differentiae that divide genera into species and thus constitute their natures.

Boethius next offers a definition of “person” that would become the standard definition throughout the mediaeval period: “A person is an individual substance of a nature endowed with reason” (72, citing OS V 3.171-172). While this definition has the advantage of explaining how human beings, as well as the members of the Trinity, are all persons, it seems to violate a well accepted principle of orthodox Christian and even neoplatonist theology—one that Boethius himself advocates: The transcendent God cannot be captured on the grid of the categories. Boethius recognizes this, however, and explains that God is a substance of a different sort from created substances. Like all substances, each divine person “substat,” that is, stands under. Created substances stand under, are subjects of, their properties. But each divine person stands under in the sense that it is the origin of all created things. In other words, the divine persons are ontological bedrock. The definition of “person,” formulated in terms of the categories, applies only by analogy to divine persons.

Marenbon finds that Boethius has struck a serious blow to the heresies by removing their motivation. Nestorius and Eutyches formulate their views because they conceive of a nature as something individual; hence, if a being has more than one nature, it must be more than one person. However, Boethius defines “nature” as something universal, and thereby removes the barrier to thinking that a single person could not have more than one nature. Marenbon is right to emphasize the originality of Boethius’s solution, and he might have brought it out more vividly by contrasting Boethius with another party to this discussion, Cyril of Alexandria. Cyril battled against his contemporary Nestorius and in many particulars anticipated Boethius’s account a century earlier. But Cyril too thought of natures as individual, and for that reason denied two natures in Christ, even though he argued for Christ’s full divinity and humanity in a single person. Boethius’ genius was to see how Aristotelian philosophy could make sense of the orthodox doctrine of Christ. Of course, Boethius’s solution does not eliminate all the paradoxes of the orthodox view. It is still hard to see how a single person can have these two natures, which are so ontologically different. But in this respect, his view is no worse off than that of Eutyches, who holds that the single nature of Christ is somehow the result of combining divine and human nature.

The Consolation of Philosophy

By far the strongest and most interesting portion of the book is its detailed explication of the Consolation (96-163). Marenbon guides the reader through each key argument of the text, and his interpretations of the individual arguments reveal a brilliance in Boethius that other commentators sometimes miss. He also points out that the work suffers from incoherence: The positions Lady Philosophy argues for are deeply incompatible with each other. It is implausible that Boethius did not care about the incoherences on the grounds that he was simply writing a consolation for a general readership; for although he was indeed writing a consolation, it is, especially in its second half, full of difficult, technical argumentation. Marenbon argues instead that the incoherences are intentional, part of Boethius’s plan for the Consolation. Although this might seem a desperate attempt to save Boethius from the bin of second-rate philosophers, Marenbon makes an interesting and fairly convincing case for this thesis. The Consolation belongs to the tradition of Menippean satire, prosimetric in form and satirical in content. By Boethius’s time, however, the genre included works whose satirical content was quite subtle. Martianus Capella’s On the Marriage of Mercury and Philology, for instance, is a work of “earnest didacticism,” and yet Martianus “encourages us to see that [his enterprise as an educator] has its pretensions and absurdities” (160-161). Boethius knew Martianus’s work and may have been following in his footsteps. Boethius’s work evinces enormous respect for philosophy, but Lady Philosophy’s arguments, while they advance Boethius toward answering his questions, do not result in a coherent, fully satisfactory reply. Philosophy is no goddess; she is human, and it may be that “the pretensions of her goddess-like initial appearance are satirized in the Consolation” (162).

The final chapter of the book traces Boethius’s immensely successful post-mortem career. Influence is hard to measure, but by any standard Boethius’s was enormous, and it extended not just to philosophy but to literature as well: The Consolation figures prominently not just in philosophical and theological texts, such as Aquinas’s treatment of happiness in the Summa theologiae, but in Jean de Meun’s Roman de la Rose and Chaucer’s Troilus and Criseyde. My only disagreement with Marenbon is that, in my view, he underestimates Boethius’s influence. He claims, for example, that Anselm did not use the Consolation as a source for his moral philosophy (176). However, in On Freedom of Choice, Anselm’s arguments that the good are always strong, while the wicked are weak, made slaves to sin by their own choice, are at least echoes of Book IV. Anselm’s dialogues also show the influence of Boethius’s logical works, especially the works on topical reasoning.