(Book 1) Hannah Arendt and Human Rights: The Predicament of Common Responsibility; (Book 2) Hannah Arendt and the Challenge of Modernity: A Phenomenology of Human Rights

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Peg Birmingham, Hannah Arendt and Human Rights: The Predicament of Common Responsibility, Indiana University Press, 2006, 161pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253218650.

Serena Parekh, Hannah Arendt and the Challenge of Modernity: A Phenomenology of Human Rights, Routledge, 2008, 219pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415961080.

Reviewed by Patchen Markell, University of Chicago



In the years following the Second World War, Hannah Arendt identified a deadly irony in the history of the idea of human rights. Appeals to human rights had long been understood as a means of protecting individuals against the nation-states to which (it was assumed) they belonged. Yet precisely because human rights discourse took national membership and the coextensivity of nations and states for granted, the idea of human rights proved disastrously impotent just when it was needed most: when the crisis of the nation-state and the rise of totalitarianism produced and then destroyed stateless persons on a mass scale. Half a century later, political philosophers concerned with the vulnerable status of refugees, migrants, and national minorities in the wake of the Cold War rediscovered Arendt’s critique of human rights, as well as her effort to reorient human rights discourse around the idea of a fundamental right to belong, or a “right to have rights” — even as some of them, most influentially Seyla Benhabib, worried that Arendt’s reconstructed conception of human rights lacked sufficiently strong “normative foundations.”1

One response to this concern might be to insist that it is misplaced: that Arendt herself would have rejected the demand for foundations as a manifestation of the relentless subordination of political freedom to philosophical certitude in what she called “the tradition” of Western political philosophy. These two recently published books on Arendt and human rights, by Peg Birmingham and Serena Parekh, adopt a different strategy. Responding directly to objections like Benhabib’s, Birmingham and Parekh argue in different ways that Arendt did indeed try to provide a new foundation for human rights, but that the foundation she offered was of a distinctive, unfamiliar kind. Generally speaking, both authors suggest that Arendt anchors human rights not in an account of human “nature” (that is, in a characterization of human beings in terms of a set of properties shared by each member of the species), but in a picture of the human “condition” (that is, in a phenomenological characterization of the basic features of human beings’ worldly existence). Such phenomenological foundations don’t possess the compulsory force of logical deductions, but they may nevertheless help to strengthen the commitment to human rights by showing us how such a commitment harmonizes with (and can thus draw sustenance from) a potentially persuasive broader portrait of human being.

Peg Birmingham’s Hannah Arendt and Human Rights is a tightly focused exposition of the aspects of Arendt’s phenomenology of the human condition that Birmingham takes to be most relevant to the project of establishing a foundation for human rights. While Arendt’s catalogue of the fundamental features of the human condition includes life, worldliness, plurality, natality, and mortality, Birmingham focuses in her first chapter on the condition, and more specifically the “event,” of natality. Natality, for Arendt, refers to the fact that individual human beings are born into the world, and this fact has two dimensions of significance, each of which is treated in detail in a further chapter of Birmingham’s book. It means, first, that human existence is characterized by the ongoing appearance and reappearance of the new: of new persons and of the new words and deeds that they utter and perform. And it means, second, that as human beings we are invariably confronted by “givenness” — the givenness of the bodies with which we are born, of the histories and relationships we are born into, and of the other people with whom we share a world.

For Birmingham, these two dimensions of natality constitute Arendt’s new “universal basis” for human rights and in particular for the “right to have rights” (12). The event of natality, Birmingham argues, “carries within it the principle of publicness,” in the sense that the appearance of the new can only take place in a public space. As a fundamental aspect of the human condition, natality thus “demands that the actor” — any human actor — “have the right to appear” (57), a right that is violated by any form of power that exiles human beings from political membership tout court and from the very possibility of public appearance that such membership carries with it. And the event of natality understood as the appearance of givenness — of the “single, unique, unchangeable” physical forms and historical legacies each of us bears in being born (73) — also demands that any human actor have the right to appear as an “embodied singular individual,” a right that is violated by forms of power that express resentment rather than gratitude toward givenness, and seek to master that givenness by — for instance — reducing unique persons to racial categories, as European imperialist ideologies had done (91, 103).

Birmingham’s first three chapters are rich and fascinating, and even apart from their relevance to issues of human rights, will be of interest to any student of Arendt’s work, and especially to readers of The Human Condition. Birmingham moves deftly between interpretations of Arendt’s work and productive discussions of several other thinkers with whom Arendt is implicitly or explicitly in conversation, including Benjamin, Kafka, Heidegger, Hobbes, and Augustine. Chapter 1 includes a particularly striking interpretation of the relationship between the physical event of birth and the linguistic dimension of natality in Arendt’s thought: while the actor’s “insertion” of herself into the world through speech is sometimes presented (by Arendt and by her readers) as a “second” birth that succeeds the first, Birmingham argues (drawing both on Arendt and on Heidegger) that the physical and linguistic dimensions of the event of natality must be understood as simultaneous and interconnected. And Birmingham’s treatment of the underappreciated theme of givenness in Arendt’s work throughout chapter 3 is one of the highlights of the book, not least because it cuts effectively against the common tendency to read Arendtian action as a sort of creation ex nihilo, unmoored from or even intrinsically antagonistic towards the given.

Yet it is also in these middle chapters that a tension begins to emerge in Birmingham’s reconstruction of an Arendtian foundation for human rights. Consider the relationship between the two arguments I have just singled out from chapters 1 and 3. In the first, Birmingham insists that physical and linguistic natality are inseparable: “Arendt never finds one without the other” (26), and this is because “to be born, to be a mortal, is to have been welcomed, to have been given a name” (33). This claim is crucial if Arendt’s idea of natality is to perform the justificatory work Birmingham assigns it: only if natality is necessarily both a biological event and a matter of public, linguistic appearance could the very idea of natality be said to “demand” that all human actors be allowed to appear and speak in public spaces. But in the second argument, about givenness, Birmingham seems to allow precisely what she had moved to exclude in the first: the possibility of a separation of physical from linguistic natality, of the reduction of linguistic to merely physical existence. This was totalitarianism’s terrible and imperfectly realized achievement; and acknowledging this is also crucial to Birmingham’s project in a different way, for only if such a separation or reduction is in principle possible — only if the given can provoke destructive resentment instead of gratitude — can natality’s “demand” really matter.

This tension — between, you might say, a sense of what the human condition “demands” that is so strong that it seems to exclude the very possibility of its denial, and a sense of what the human condition “demands” that is too weak to guarantee human rights even in the face of the relentless skeptic — seems to me unavoidable in any project that aims to found a political or ethical practice on phenomenological or ontological considerations. As I read her, Birmingham negotiates this tension by leaning, decisively though by no means completely, toward its latter pole, tacitly moderating the strength of the foundationalism she ascribes to Arendt. This is most clearly visible in the excellent last chapter of the book, in which Birmingham brings together Arendt’s treatment of radical evil and Julia Kristeva’s psychoanalytic account of the social implications of embodiment. Birmingham persuasively shows that for Arendt, at least in her early writings, “the event of natality itself” can provoke terror as well as gratitude; it thus “carries with it … the ever-present threat of radical evil,” which can be understood as the “refusal” of the finitude that comes with natality (113). Kristeva sharpens and deepens this point by resisting Arendt’s own impulse, especially later in her career, to exile embodiment and physicality (and the terror they can provoke) outside the boundaries of the political. For Kristeva, the irreducible place of fear in social and political life is rooted in the “immemorial violence” of the physical separation of one body from another, and in the destructive impulses this violence occasions — which, importantly, come into view precisely in the gap between physical and linguistic natality (115-116). It is significant that Birmingham, in this last chapter, refers to the human condition in terms of a “predicament,” for while a predicament may seem an unstable thing on which to found a commitment to human rights, what Birmingham thus loses in certitude she regains in a more faithful rendering of the necessary fragility of Arendt’s response to her dark times.

Serena Parekh, too, is concerned to reconstruct an Arendtian foundation for human rights, but her book ranges somewhat more widely than Birmingham’s across Arendtian topics and texts. Hannah Arendt and the Challenge of Modernity is, at one level, a survey of Arendt’s philosophy and political thought through the thematic lens of human rights, which shows that a great deal of Arendt’s work grows out of her explicit confrontation of the crisis of human rights in the immediate postwar period. (As such it would make a fine introduction to Arendt’s political thought for readers with a particular interest in this theme.) While Parekh’s book is not strictly chronological, its first four chapters do more or less trace a path from The Origins of Totalitarianism, through The Human Condition, and into Arendt’s later writings on Kant’s Critique of Judgment and other subjects. Although one could take issue with some of the details of Parekh’s readings in these chapters, there is much to appreciate here. I was especially pleased, for instance, by Parekh’s attention to the fact that The Human Condition is simultaneously a general phenomenology of human activity and a historically specific account of the significance of modernity, which makes that text useful not only for re-founding human rights but also for deepening our understanding of the limits of those forms of human-rights discourse that rest on appeals to human dignity non-intersubjectively conceived. I was also fascinated by Parekh’s treatment of a late lecture of Arendt’s called “Public Rights and Private Interests,” which presents a very different picture of the relationship between political issues and economic questions than readers of On Revolution or The Human Condition would expect: here, as elsewhere, Parekh’s work opens out beyond the question of how to justify the elementary right to have rights — which, strictly speaking, was the only “human” right Arendt recognized — and toward such other, equally important questions as the relationship between political and social rights.

It is in the last two chapters of the book that Parekh takes up the question of the foundations of human rights at greatest length, though she also discusses this question in chapter 1 (which includes a brief but illuminating treatment of Birmingham’s argument). Parekh’s position is complex, and her rhetoric and metatheoretical comments occasionally show the strain of the effort to find a stable middle ground for Arendt between the extremes she calls “essentialism” and “anti-essentialism” (122): early in the book Parekh characterizes Arendt as an “anti-foundationalist” because she “does not give us what we usually expect from someone championing human rights — a clear and compelling reason that we should uphold them under any circumstances” (36); in a later chapter, however, Parekh says that Arendt “gives us a strong reason for believing in human rights” (122). But this may sound more contradictory than it is. Parekh’s point is simply that Arendt’s phenomenology of the human condition isn’t the sort of thing that is meant to compel assent in the manner of a deduction from agreed-upon premises: to the extent that Arendt’s phenomenology of the human condition constitutes a “foundation,” it works by inculcating in its readers a full appreciation of the stakes of our decisions and commitments about human rights, helping us to see how much else may stand and fall with our willingness to defend a basic right to political membership. This is why Parekh says, in an especially helpful passage, that Arendt was engaged first and foremost in “a project of understanding,” and that her method was more disclosive than argumentative (5). This may seem like a softer kind of foundationalism than Birmingham’s, but given the tacit moderation that Birmingham’s argument seems to undergo as it proceeds, I think it is fairer to say that Parekh’s metatheoretical comments fit well with the ultimate stances of both books.

At the level of substance, however, Parekh departs in two crucial ways from Birmingham’s position. First, as Parekh herself explains, she dissents from one key aspect of Birmingham’s account of “givenness” and its importance to the idea of human rights. As I noted earlier, Birmingham distinguishes between those works (especially Origins) in which Arendt identifies givenness with “mere unqualified existence” and affirms it as such, and those works (such as The Human Condition) in which Arendt herself seems inclined to exile givenness in this sense — in the sense of “mere life” or zoe — into the private sphere (75). Birmingham regards this latter inclination as pernicious and seeks to recover and strengthen the first strand in Arendt’s work. Parekh disagrees. For Parekh, Arendt’s hostility to “life” in The Human Condition should be understood not as an all-too-familiar expression of resentment toward givenness and embodiment as such, but as an attack on the valorization of mere life in the problematic form it takes in the modern age. (This aspect of Parekh’s disagreement with Birmingham thus shows how much is at stake in the question of whether to read The Human Condition as a historically specific critique of modernity — a reading it invites — or as an account of the transhistorical features of the human condition — a reading it also invites.) Even more deeply, Parekh sees this emphasis on gratitude for givenness in the form of mere life as incompatible with the foundation Arendt tries to lay for human rights, for on Parekh’s reading, the “right to have rights” is best understood as a right to transform one’s given, “bare” life, or zoe, into the distinctive life of a unique individual with an identity, a bios (39).

It is important to see this difference between Birmingham and Parekh in its full depth. By rooting the idea of human rights, in the end, in the common human capacity to develop mere life into “full humanity” (147), Parekh does help to explain how an appeal to ontology can have normative force: in effect, she bridges the gap between the invariant facts of the human condition and the contingent decision to establish and recognize human rights by appealing to something like the distinction between potentiality and actuality — between the universally shared capacity to become fully human, and the fragile practices and institutions that allow people to exercise that capacity and to realize that potential. At the same time, however, this strategy seems to me to pull Parekh, somewhat against her own intentions and characterizations of her argument, back in the direction of a conception of human rights grounded in an appeal to human nature, in the sense of a set of worthy features — capacities, in this case — possessed by each member of the species. Perhaps falling back on such a conception is ultimately the only way to persuasively answer human-rights skeptics — in which case we should be led to suspect that there is a stronger affinity between the very project of philosophical foundation-giving and the discourse of human nature than Parekh, or indeed Birmingham, allows — and I’m not convinced in the end that this is the path Arendt’s thought follows, especially in light of Birmingham’s persuasive account of Arendt’s resistance to seeing appearance in terms of potentiality and actuality (83-85).

But there is a second way in which Parekh departs from Birmingham, and indeed from the whole debate between “essentialist” and “anti-essentialist” stances towards the philosophical status of human rights. In the last chapter of Hannah Arendt and the Challenge of Modernity, Parekh argues in a different vein that “conscience” — in Arendt’s specific sense of our resistance, as thinking creatures, to doing anything that would leave us unable to live with or be in harmony with ourselves — can serve a “subjective but not arbitrary” (153) foundation for a commitment to human rights. What Parekh means by “subjective” here is important: it indicates not that human rights are to be grounded in a specific kind of reason (namely, reasons that happen to appeal to the preferences or prejudices of this or that individual), but that there is some familiar dimension of human experience — in this case the experience of being alone with oneself involved in thinking — that, on Parekh’s view, will tend to sustain a commitment to human rights (162). Whether one agrees or disagrees with this estimate of the power of conscience, this is a radical and welcome move, insofar as it shifts the discussion of the foundations of human rights beyond the register of pure argumentation: the fate of human rights depends on more (or perhaps less) than philosophical rigor.

Still, this strategy also discloses what seems to me the most serious dilemma involved in the effort to establish foundations for the commitment to human rights, philosophically or otherwise, one that arises not out of any generic feature of foundationalism, but out of the specific kind of thing that human rights are. What made the absence of an institutionally guaranteed right to have rights so catastrophic in the twentieth century is that such a right, if it had existed, would have functioned as a last-ditch form of protection in the face of unprecedentedly terrifying forms of domination. Yet if it turned out that such a protection, to be effective, would itself depend on the proper operation of conscience among the citizens who share the world, or on the successful cultivation of an ethos of gratitude rather than resentment in the face of givenness, or on a widespread appreciation of the equal capacity of all human beings to speak and act in public, then a world in which human rights were well-founded might well turn out to be a world in which they were no longer so urgently needed. Perhaps that is why Arendt herself, when she used the language of “foundations” in connection with the right to have rights in the first edition of Origins, did not refer to the foundations, conceptual or otherwise, of human rights: instead, she suggested that the institutionalization of a right to have rights, and of the idea of a crime against humanity, could itself turn out to be a “new foundation for human community as such.”2 The connections that Birmingham and Parekh establish between the idea of human rights and such Arendtian themes as natality, plurality, and publicity go both ways, after all: could Arendt, in 1951, have been trying to anchor a broader stance toward human existence in a concrete set of postwar political possibilities — to “found” a philosophy on a politics, rather than the other way around? To say that these books provoke but do not answer this question is not to minimize their accomplishment: on their own and especially in combination, they initiate an important new direction in the interpretation and appropriation of Arendt’s political thought.

1 Seyla Benhabib, The Reluctant Modernism of Hannah Arendt, new ed. (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2003 [orig. ed. 1996]), 82, 193.

2 Hannah Arendt, The Origins of Totalitarianism (New York: Schocken Books, 2004 1951), 627.