These volumes are certain to become the standard history of analytic philosophy, and with good reason: they are clearly written, carefully argued, densely packed books, by a leading contemporary philosopher. They will help to shape a generation’s conception of the history of their discipline. Yet, in spite of their many virtues, there is cause to worry in this fact. For they also have many flaws, organizational, historical, and interpretive. As a result, readers of Soames’s books may come away with a distorted and incomplete picture of the history of analytic philosophy.
Soames traces the development of analytic philosophy from the beginning of the twentieth century to the early 1970s. Volume 1 covers Moore, Russell, early Wittgenstein, logical positivism, and early Quine; Volume 2 takes up later Wittgenstein, ordinary language philosophy, later Quine, Davidson, and Kripke. A welcome feature is the inclusion of discussions of practical philosophy. Soames offers chapters on Moore’s Principia Ethica, Stevenson’s emotivism, Ross’s normative ethics, and Hare’s performative account of “good”. However, these chapters subserve the primary aims of the books, which are in the realm of theoretical, rather than practical philosophy.
Soames identifies the “most important achievements” of analytic philosophy as “(i) the recognition that philosophical speculation must be grounded in pre-philosophical thought, and (ii) the success achieved in understanding, and separating from one another, the fundamental methodological notions of logical consequence, logical truth, necessary truth, and a priori truth.” (Vol. 1, xi) He traces (i) to Moore’s defense of common sense, and sees the tradition as repeatedly called back to this important insight. (ii), in contrast, comes at the end of his story, in Kripke’s Naming and Necessity. For Soames, “no philosophical advance of the twentieth century is more significant, more far-reaching, and destined to be more long-lasting.” (Vol. 1, xii) Soames repeatedly criticizes Kripke’s predecessors for failing to distinguish analyticity, a prioricity, necessity, and so on, and traces the characteristic difficulties of their philosophies to this root — sometimes more and sometimes less persuasively. The resulting story is appealing in its linear convergence towards the great achievement of a single towering figure — but it is also prone to oversimplification and misunderstanding of the successes and failures of earlier philosophers.
Given Soames’s view of the great achievements of analytic philosophy, it is not surprising that his discussions of practical philosophy function primarily to illustrate his broader philosophical themes. On their own, these chapters leave a disappointing impression — a succession of failed theories with no positive resolution. In an Epilogue, Soames mentions Rawls as one of “two philosophers not discussed here who … fit naturally into the group we have focused on.” (Vol. 2, 461) Soames explains the omission of Rawls’s A Theory of Justice, and Nozick’s Anarchy, State, and Utopia, as based on “purely autobiographical” reasons: “I used to teach this material … eventually the syllabus became so over-crowded that they had to be dropped. Since adding a discussion of them now would take considerable time, and result in substantial lengthening of a work that is already quite long … I have decided to leave the gap unfilled.” (Vol. 2, 462) Discussion of these books, both published after Naming and Necessity, would also have interfered with Soames’s narrative, however. Neither work shows the influence of Kripke’s fundamental methodological distinctions.
Besides Rawls, Soames considers one other omission to be worthy of comment: Frege. Soames admits that “although his work is undoubtedly technical, and although most of it falls outside our official period … his omission amounts to an undeniable gap in the story …”. (Vol. 2, 461-2) He sees this as part of a broader omission of “an important tradition in logic” running from Frege to Kripke, which he hopes to address in a later work. (Vol. 1, xvii; Vol. 2, 462) Among the figures to be discussed in this work are such pure logicians as Church and Tarski, but also such important philosophers as C.I. Lewis, Carnap, and David Lewis. But it is doubtful that these figures, or indeed Frege himself, can be adequately assessed through a study of the development of logic. In the story as Soames projects it, the place of C.I. Lewis and Carnap is in the “development of modal logic and modal semantics,” and the importance of “this line of work” is in its “connections to other, broader, less technical issues in philosophy, and ultimately to the singular achievement of separating and understanding the different modalities …”. (Vol. 2, 462) Here Soames’s story of progress towards Kripke’s achievement distorts the significance and achievement of thinkers like Carnap and C.I. Lewis. It is hard to see where The Logical Syntax of Language or Mind and the World Order, say, would fit into the slot Soames has reserved for discussion of these philosophers.
Soames ends his story with Kripke because of the specialization and fragmentation that has marked analytic philosophy since 1970. “A history of the last thirty-plus years,” he says, would “look not like one linear and integrated story, but like many distinct and overlapping stories.” (Vol. 2, 464) Soames apparently believes that a history from 1900 to 1970 can be told as “one linear and integrated story,” and that he has done so — the only significant gaps being the omissions of Rawls and Frege. “Apart from this, there are, I believe, no other comparable gaps in the story … that I have been able to tell.” (Vol. 2, 463) Yet it is easy to think of many other gaps, if one steps away from Soames’s preferred narrative. Reflection on the following (partial) list suggests that for the earlier twentieth century, we also need “many distinct and overlapping stories.”
Soames nowhere discusses American philosophy prior to Quine. Pragmatism, Peirce, James, and Dewey are not mentioned. Neither is the Vienna Circle — logical positivism is represented by Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic and reduced to conventionalism about the a priori and verificationism about meaning. Shadowy figures called “the early positivists” appear occasionally, but the names “Schlick” and “Neurath” occur only in a footnote. Missing are the program of unified science, debates over scientific method and the structure of scientific theories, theories of confirmation and probability. Carnap’s philosophy is barely touched upon. Wilfrid Sellars, whose “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind” was among the most influential works of the twentieth century, does not appear at all. Discussion of Sellars would have been very helpful in conjunction with Soames’s analysis of Ryle’s The Concept of Mind and Austin’s Sense and Sensibilia. The rise of computational models of the mind, and functionalism, is nowhere in evidence. Kuhn is absent, as is the revolution in philosophy of science brought about by The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. And on and on. Fitting any of these developments into Soames’s story would not only have lengthened his already long books, it would have interrupted the flow of his narrative. Yet all these developments remain influential and important in the fragmented and specialized world of twenty-first century analytic philosophy. It is only from the point of view of one of contemporary philosophy’s many balkanized fiefdoms that the story which ends with Kripke can appear as the story of twentieth-century philosophy.
Soames tells us that “this history grew out of two lecture courses given at Princeton University.” (Vol. 1, ix) The origin of these books in lecture notes helps to account for much of their strength but also many of their flaws. Offering a unified, linear narrative of progress makes a good deal of pedagogical sense. A survey of the history of analytic philosophy often serves as an introduction to the field. In such a context it is natural to emphasize strands in the history leading up to one’s own interests and preoccupations. Thus, it is unsurprising that Soames’s culminating chapters on Kripke are as much about Soames’s own works as about Naming and Necessity.
Soames concentrates on careful analysis and criticism of specific primary sources. This method, common and successful in the classroom, allows him to develop some compelling arguments, deserving careful study. Among others, his critique of Quine on indeterminacy of translation, and his honest and thorough treatment of difficulties with Kripke’s arguments for the necessary a posteriori and the contingent a priori, are worthy of special mention. Nonetheless, Soames’s method does not always translate well from the lecture hall to the printed page. The books are uneven in many ways, reflecting Soames’s varying level of expertise. This comes out in the lists of suggested additional readings appended to the twelve major parts of the two volumes. For example, the suggestions for Volume 1, Part Three, "Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus," consist of one book and three articles. While the one book, by Robert Fogelin, is a standard secondary source, the other pieces all discuss a fine point concerning the expressive capacity of Wittgenstein’s logic — an issue first raised in Fogelin’s book. In contrast, the list of additional readings for Volume 2, Part Seven, “Saul Kripke on Naming and Necessity,” includes 9 books and 36 articles. The difference between these lists does not reflect the relative sizes of the two literatures, or the quality of the work. One is left to suppose that it reflects the state of Soames’s own expertise.
The introductory paragraphs of Soames’s chapters exhibit another form of unevenness. Sometimes, Soames supplies a thumbnail biography of a philosopher (“George Edward Moore was born the son of a doctor, in 1873 …” — Vol. 1, 3). However, he includes such information for only about half of the authors he takes up. Thus the reader learns, for example, that W.D. Ross was Provost of Oriel College (Vol. 1, 320), but not that Wittgenstein came from Vienna, or was influenced by philosophers other than Russell. This disparity can distort the reader’s perception of a philosopher’s relative importance: as far as one can gather from Soames, Strawson might have been a minor figure who co-authored a response to Quine and wrote a confused paper on truth.
These are minor quibbles, however. More significant concerns also stem, in part, from the origin of these volumes in lectures. Soames sometimes engages in deliberate oversimplification of the sort that often helps to get across a point in a classroom. He presents “standard” interpretations without considering recent scholarship that casts them into doubt. By focusing on his selected texts, he ignores other works by the same authors that might affect his interpretations. Finally, his desire to construct a narrative leading up to Kripke’s culminating achievement sometimes blinds him to valuable insights of the philosophers he is discussing. All these faults are understandable given the constraints of a lecture course; but they are not so easily excused in a published history. I will illustrate these problems with Soames’s discussions of four figures: Russell, Wittgenstein, Ryle, and Kripke.
Russell: Soames concentrates on the period from “On Denoting” (1905) to the Lectures on Logical Atomism (1918). He discusses Russell’s theory of descriptions, his acquaintance-based epistemology, his reduction of mathematics to logic, his logical construction program, and his logical atomism. This is all very clearly written, and Soames makes pointed criticisms of Russell’s applications of the theory of descriptions and of his use of logical constructions to account for knowledge of the external world. There is only one problem. Much of what Soames says is just wrong. He acknowledges that he has oversimplified and modernized Russell’s logic, presumably in an effort to make complex matters more accessible to the uninitiated. But his acknowledgments are inadequate and easy to miss, and the reader may easily come away with false beliefs about Russell’s logic and his philosophy.
Soames’s discussion of the theory of descriptions opens with a passage from The Principles of Mathematics (1903) in which Russell argues that it is either false or meaningless to deny existence — to assert that A does not exist. Soames treats the problem of negative existentials as the motivation for the theory of descriptions, asserting that this theory allowed Russell to reject his earlier extreme realism. (Vol. 1, 94-101) Recent scholarship, however, has established that this view of the motivation for the theory of descriptions is largely false. Although Russell did apply the theory of descriptions to negative existentials, his earlier theory of denoting concepts, found in Principles, was also capable of accounting for the meaningfulness and truth of denials of existence, as Russell realized prior to “On Denoting.” Russell did reject the theory of denoting concepts in favor of the theory of descriptions, but his motivations for this had little to do with negative existentials. The opening and closing paragraphs of “On Denoting” make clear that, for Russell, the primary interest of the theory of descriptions lies in its ability to account for knowledge about things with which we are not directly acquainted. The problem of negative existentials motivates at most that part of “On Denoting” which covers definite descriptions. But Russell provides an account of all “denoting phrases,” a class which includes indefinite descriptions (“a horse”), and universal phrases (“every doctor”). The latter are of particular interest to Russell since they involve our ability to think of all members of infinite totalities, even though we can’t have acquaintance with every member of such classes.
Before formally presenting the theory of descriptions, Soames introduces “Russell’s Formal Language and Its Interpretation.” (Vol. 1, 101-6) The language is first-order logic with identity; Soames carefully lays out its syntax and provides a “Russellian Interpretation,” specifying a structure of non-linguistic propositions and precise rules determining what proposition each sentence expresses, and under what conditions it is true.
Soames admits that “the truth conditions given here for propositions expressed by existential and universal generalizations, though Russellian in spirit, are more specific than any given by Russell himself. They employ ideas first explicitly developed by Alfred Tarski in the 1930s.” (Vol. 1, 106, fn 8) Russell, however, never gave the kind of recursive formulation of syntax and semantics presented by Soames. One has to look to later logicians for this, not only for the treatment of the quantifiers. Moreover, Russell’s logical language was never first-order logic with identity. Russell allowed higher-order quantification, and in Principia Mathematica identity is not a primitive predicate but is defined. Furthermore, although earlier Russell believed that sentences express non-linguistic propositions, from Principia (1910) through the rest of the period that Soames discusses, he rejected such theories. Russell’s difficulty, never mentioned by Soames, was in understanding how a non-linguistic proposition could be false. According to Soames, a relational proposition aRb is a complex consisting of the relation R and the objects a and b. (Vol. 1, 105) Russell’s worry was that if this complex existed, then, in it, a and b would be related by R, so that aRb would be true.
Russell, consequently, replaced the theory of non-linguistic propositions with his “multiple-relation theory of judgment.” He tried to account for apparent references to propositions by giving an account of the contexts in which they appear, such as attributions of judgment and other propositional attitudes. He treated propositional attitudes not as two-place relations between a subject and a proposition, but as multigrade relations between a subject and the entities judged about. This theory, which appears in the Lectures on Logical Atomism, is not mentioned by Soames. He skirts the issue by referring only obscurely to Russell’s attempts to deal with propositional attitudes: “Russell needed a new category of fact corresponding to … true propositional-attitude sentences … I will not present Russell’s analysis of these sentences, and the facts corresponding to them. Although it is quite interesting, it is also complicated. Russell himself had doubts about it, and never really completed his line of thought.” (Vol. 1, 191) The reader may wonder, however, why Russell didn’t simply take propositional attitudes to be relations between subjects and propositions. Later, Soames boggles at skepticism about propositions — yet here he has not given voice to the first proponent of such skepticism in the analytic tradition, Russell himself.
Soames’s falsification of Russell’s views continues in his chapter on logicism. Soames first provides a formal language and theory of arithmetic. (Vol. 1, 138) The language has three non-logical primitives, “N,” “0,” and " ’ " (for successor). The theory consists of the five Peano axioms in their first-order form, with the induction postulate given as a schema. Russell, however, used higher-order quantification and so could write the induction postulate as a single axiom. Soames’s presentation also requires two predicates, “∈” (membership) and “=,” which Soames says "Russell regarded … as logical primitives." (Vol. 1, 138) In fact, however, each is a defined symbol in Principia.
Soames goes on to present “Russell’s System of Logic” to which arithmetic is to be reduced. (Vol. 1, 140-143) The system has three basic principles: an axiom schema of comprehension, an axiom of extensionality, and an axiom of infinity. Soames admits that while “the system I have described is close to the system that Russell actually used … it differs from it in important respects.” (Vol. 1, 142) He notes that his version of the comprehension scheme is unrestricted, whereas Russell would restrict comprehension in accordance with the theory of types. However, Soames seriously underestimates his departures from Principia, in which both comprehension and extensionality are theorems, not axioms, and comprehension, like induction, can be expressed in a single axiom.
Thus Soames treats Russell’s defined signs as primitive, and Russell’s theorems as axioms. These errors reflect a fundamental misunderstanding of Russell’s philosophy of logic. Soames sees the infinity axiom as “guaranteeing the existence of a sufficient number of logical objects” with which to identify the numbers. (Vol. 1, 140) This is to confuse the logicism of Principia with that of Frege’s Foundations of Arithmetic. For Russell there are no logical objects: there are no numbers and there are no classes to identify them with. He provides a contextual definition of classes, modeled on the theory of descriptions. Through this definition, talk of classes is reduced to quantification over “propositional functions” — roughly, to talk of properties. This enables Russell to define class membership and to prove comprehension and extensionality. But the key point that Soames misses is that Russell’s reduction of arithmetic to logic involves an ontological reduction of classes. Since this reduction was the prototype for the method of logical constructions employed in Russell’s external-world program, Soames also misses an opportunity to shed light on that program, by falsifying Russell’s view of classes.
Soames’s misrepresentation of Russell is completed with his account of the theory of types. (Vol. 1, 150-157) Soames motivates the theory of types solely through Russell’s paradox. Hence what he presents is Ramsey’s simple theory of types: we have a basic type of individuals, and then types of sets of individuals, sets of sets of individuals, and so on. Russell, however, came to see his paradox as part of a broader family of self-referential antinomies including such paradoxes as the Liar. His theory of types was to provide a unified solution to this whole family. He motivated this unified theory through the “Vicious Circle Principle,” that no totality could include members defined in terms of that totality. Russell, understanding quantification as involving the totality of instances of the variable, concluded that no proposition, or propositional function, could be a value of any quantified variable occurring in it. For Russell, moreover, it is not classes, but propositional functions that are assigned types. The result is the ramified theory of types, in which the type of a propositional function depends not only on the suitable arguments to the function but also on the entities quantified over in the function. No hint of this theory occurs in Soames’s text, nor is the Vicious Circle Principle mentioned as a motivation for the theory of types.
Once again, Soames hints at the simplification and falsification involved in his account, without actually admitting its true nature: “This is, of course, a very brief and sketchy introduction to Russell’s theory of logical types, which is itself an extremely complicated subject. Fortunately, we can ignore most of the complications.” (Vol. 1, 154) Soames can ignore the complications because they do not contribute to his narrative; the fact that these complications were essential to Russell’s self-understanding is beside the point.
So, Soames’s version of Russell’s logic differs from Russell’s logic in expressive resources, in primitive signs and definitions, in basic axioms and theorems, and in its theory of meaningful expressions and logical types. A reader of Soames who turned to a close study of Russell would be surprised by what she would find in Principia. As we often do in the classroom, Soames has constructed a set of stories about a philosopher named “Russell.” But the differences between actual Russell and Soames’s “Russell” are not mere matters of presentation. They touch fundamental philosophical issues, such as his motivation for the theory of descriptions, his ontology, his account of meaningful expressions, and his theory of propositional attitudes.
Soames’s simplifications and modifications of Russell’s logic are no doubt aimed at making complicated and difficult material comprehensible. But Soames is not sufficiently forthright about the degree of simplification and falsification required. A reader who has actually read Russell may wonder whether Soames’s presentations of less familiar figures (in my case, Stevenson, Ross, and Hare, for example) might be marred by similar misrepresentations.
Wittgenstein: The situation is somewhat different with Soames’s chapters on Wittgenstein. He presents a fairly standard account of Wittgenstein’s thought and development but neglects to discuss the considerable secondary literature running counter to this interpretation. For example, Soames reads the Tractatus as arguing for a metaphysics of logical atomism. He provides many citations in support of this interpretation. However he does not cite crucial remarks such as 3.3 — “only in the context of a proposition has a name meaning” — and 3.42 — “Although a proposition may only determine one place in logical space, the whole logical space must already be given by it” — which suggest a holist, rather than atomist reading. Soames claims that Wittgenstein’s closing description of the book as nonsense is based on the application of a “test of intelligibility” derived from the book’s theory of language, to that theory itself. Soames thinks that
there are two ways of viewing Wittgenstein’s final position. On one view, the Tractatus as a whole is self-defeating and/or self-contradictory, despite its illuminating insights on many points. Thus, the Tractarian system must be rejected, and we should strive to find ways of preserving its insights while avoiding its clear inadequacies. On another view, the Tractatus is acceptable as it stands. In it, Wittgenstein has deliberately violated the rules of language in an attempt to show us what those rules really are; to get us to see what the rules of intelligible thought and language really are, he had to go beyond them. At the time he wrote the Tractatus, Wittgenstein adopted the second view. Later, he had the good sense to change his mind. In my opinion, the first view of the Tractatus is clearly correct. (Vol. 1, 252-253)
This neglects a recent, influential interpretation, according to which there is a third way to read the Tractatus. On this reading, which has been the focus of ongoing scholarly debate for more than a decade, Wittgenstein traffics in nonsense, but not by violating some criterion of intelligibility in order to show the unsayable limits of the sayable; yet the book is not simply a broken and self-refuting text, to be mined for insights that survive its self-destruction. Rather, the Tractatus undermines philosophical theorizing by showing how philosophical theories degenerate into nonsense — by allowing the reader to see, in trying to understand them, that in the end they fail to make sense. Central to this reading is Wittgenstein’s claim (5.4733), not cited by Soames, that "if [a proposition] has no sense this can only be because we have given no meaning to some of its constituent parts." This suggests that to reveal some piece of philosophy as nonsense, we have to ask what its author’s words mean, and show that in fact they mean nothing — not by applying some intelligibility test, but by appealing to the other’s sense of what he wanted his words to say.
Soames sees the Tractatus as putting forth philosophical theories, in spite of Wittgenstein’s claim (4.112) that “Philosophy is not a body of doctrine but an activity … . Philosophy does not result in ‘philosophical propositions’, but rather in the clarification of propositions.” Soames quotes this passage (Vol. 1, 251) but neglects its anti-theoretical force. Soames sees in it a commitment to the “linguistic turn” and a conception of philosophy as “linguistic analysis.” But, Soames remarks, "Wittgenstein did not follow his own advice … he practiced a kind of philosophy that his own doctrines characterize as impossible." (Vol. 1, 252, my emphasis)
Soames only fully recognizes Wittgenstein’s “deflationary conception of philosophy” in his discussion of the Philosophical Investigations. He summarizes “Wittgenstein’s conception of philosophy”:
The philosophical analysis of language does not aim at, and cannot issue in, theories of any kind. Philosophy … is the untangling of linguistic confusions achieved by examining our words as they are ordinarily used, and contrasting that use with how the words are misused in philosophical theories and explanations. If philosophy were properly done, there would be no philosophical theories and explanations, since there is nothing for philosophy to explain. Its task is essentially therapeutic — to untangle particular confusions. (Vol. 2, 27)
Soames sees this conception as both “new” and “derivative from … [Wittgenstein’s] new ideas about meaning.” (Vol. 2, 27, 29) These “new ideas” boil down to the rejection of the claims that meaning can be revealed through expression in a formal calculus and that the analysis of a linguistic expression proceeds by stating precise rules for using that expression. While Soames is surely right that these are important themes in the Investigations, he does not notice that much of this “deflationary conception of philosophy” is already in the Tractatus, in which the ideas of a formal language as revealing true logical form and of meaning as determining fixed rules of use are still apparently accepted by Wittgenstein.
Soames concludes his discussion of Wittgenstein with a chapter on the private language argument. He first discusses Wittgenstein’s views on meaning and understanding, then presents the private language argument as an application of the lessons of this discussion. Soames adopts the view that, for Wittgenstein, “some sort of conformity with community use provides standards of correctness for an individual’s use of many of our most basic terms.” (Vol. 2, 34, fn 2) Again, Soames neglects a large scholarly controversy, which has brought into question many claims around which he builds his story. Curiously, while Soames often supplies copious quotations from the figures he discusses, his summary of Wittgenstein’s general views on meaning and understanding (Vol. 2, 33-44) is not based on a single piece of textual evidence.
But what is most missing throughout Soames’s discussion of Wittgenstein is any recognition of the strangeness of Wittgenstein’s writing, the way in which it fails to conform to the usual conventions of academic philosophy — both in the oracular pronouncements of the Tractatus, and in the rambling internal dialogue of the Investigations. Wittgenstein describes the latter work as traveling “over a wide field of thought criss-cross in every direction” and as “a number of sketches of landscapes … made in the course of … long and involved journeyings.” (Investigations, Preface) Soames recasts Wittgenstein’s philosophy in the form of theses and arguments. His reading of the Investigations, in particular, does not grasp the way in which Wittgenstein’s work consists of investigations.
Ryle: One has a sense that Wittgenstein’s mode of philosophizing is too alien for Soames to fully enter into and so to understand. Something similar can be said of Soames’s discussions of ordinary language philosophy. Soames at times fails to appreciate the subtle linguistic distinctions that were the stock in trade of these philosophers. Consequently, he sometimes misses their insights and oversimplifies their concerns.
Consider, for example, his critique of Ryle’s discussion of fatalism. Ryle considers the following argument:
… if it was true beforehand — forever beforehand — that I was to cough and go to bed on those two moments on Sunday, 25 January 1953, then it was impossible for me not to do so. There would be a contradiction in the joint assertion that it was true that I would do something at a certain time and that I did not do it. This argument is perfectly general … . So nothing that does occur could have been helped and nothing that has not actually been done could possibly have been done. (Dilemmas, 15)
For Soames, this argument suffers from a simple scope ambiguity. The premise “if p was true beforehand then it was impossible that not p” is ambiguous between:
(1) if p was true beforehand, then necessarily p, and
(2) necessarily, if p was true beforehand, then p.
(2) is true but does not imply, even together with the premise that p was true beforehand, the conclusion that it was impossible that not p. (1) does imply this conclusion, but is, arguably, false.
Soames complains that Ryle does not make this elementary point. He admits that Ryle says some illuminating things in his discussion of the argument, but he “hasn’t located … its central confusion.” Soames attributes this failure to Ryle’s rejection of “the old paradigm of analysis” in favor of “giving us something that at times seems to be a fog of analysis — a collection of related points no one of which is absolutely fundamental.” (Vol. 2, 79) Soames sees in Ryle an “ideological commitment to blurred edges, indirectness, and an unwillingness to separate tangential from central issues” so that “central philosophical points get missed, as in the elementary example of fatalism.” Ryle’s methodology too often “degenerate[s] into a recipe for generating a conceptual fog.” (Vol. 2, 80-81)
However, a more careful consideration of the argument for fatalism suggests that Soames has missed much of Ryle’s point. Soames takes the argument to have the (equivocal) form:
(A) p is now true
(B) if p is now true, then p was true beforehand
Therefore © p was true beforehand (From (A) and (B))
(D) if p was true beforehand, then it is now impossible that not p (true if read as (2))
Therefore, (E) it was impossible that not p (from ©, (D) — reading (D) as (1)).
However, attention to Ryle’s formulation of the argument’s conclusion suggests another interpretation. Soames puts the conclusion in terms of the necessity of what is to come, but Ryle speaks of what is “inevitable,” what “could not have been helped.” Now, one might suppose that: (I) the past, can’t be helped, is inevitable; and (II) what is necessitated by the inevitable is inevitable. This leads to the argument:
(A) p is now true
(B) if p is now true, then p was true beforehand
Therefore © p was true beforehand
Therefore (D’) inevitably, p was true beforehand (From © and (I))
(E’) necessarily, if p was true beforehand, then p
Therefore (F) inevitably, p (From (D’), (E’), and (II))
No such argument is explicitly stated by Ryle. Nonetheless, by considering it one can see the relevance of Ryle’s critique of the fatalist’s thinking.
Ryle begins with a discussion of premise (B), asking about the status of the “p” which is said to have been true “beforehand.” He considers three possibilities: (a) p is an “eternal but unsupported pre-existing” entity; (b) p is an actual past assertion; © “p” refers counterfactually to possible past assertions — so, © amounts to “if anyone had asserted in the past that p, then their assertion would have been correct.” (Dilemmas, 17) Ryle thinks that because there is “something intolerably vacuous” in the idea of (a), we inevitably slide into thinking about (B) in terms of (b). Read in this way, however, (B) becomes a historical falsehood rather than a truism, in most cases. Hence, Ryle thinks, © provides the best way of reading (B). But, he argues, in claiming that a counterfactual past assertion of p would have been correct, we are simply conveying the information that p, not saying anything about the past. Read in this way, step © becomes the wrong sort of claim to combine with principle (I) to obtain step (D’).
Soames does not mention reading © of premise (B), and so misses the relevance of Ryle’s discussion of the correctness of past predictions. Soames does discuss Ryle’s suspicions of reading (a). To the question "what is this it that is supposed to have been true?" Soames offers as “the natural answer” “it is a proposition about what was then the future. It, that proposition, was true at some past time. What is intolerably vacuous about this?” (Vol. 2, 77) This answer is astonishing. Clearly, Ryle would find it no more satisfying than "it’s just the it that is supposed to have been true." Soames brushes away any suspicion about the existence of “propositions.” Yet, as we’ve seen, in his chapter on Russell he neglected to discuss important reasons for such skepticism.
Soames thinks of himself here, I suspect, as applying Moore’s lesson that common sense trumps philosophical skepticism — obviously, there are “propositions,” the things we believe, assert, and doubt, and obviously these exist independently of our believing, asserting, and doubting. Yet many philosophers would see this as a product of philosophical theorizing rather than a piece of common sense on the order of “there are other people.” Thus, Moore’s recognition that “philosophical speculation must be grounded in pre-philosophical thought” may become a means to disguise philosophical speculation as pre-philosophical thought.
Ryle moves from premise (B) to “the fatalist conclusion, namely that since whatever is was to be, therefore nothing can be helped.” (Dilemmas, 20) He points out that a parallel argument from the truth of future retrodictions of current events would not be similarly troubling. This highlights the importance of the pastness of the “truth beforehand” that p to the argument that p’s truth is inevitable. He goes on to suggest that in finding the argument persuasive, we slide into thinking of the necessary connection between past and present truth as a form of causal necessitation. In effect, he claims that the argument equivocates between two senses of necessitation and inevitability — logical necessitation, which relates propositions, and the logical inevitability of a logical consequence of a true premise; and causal necessitation, which relates events, and the practical inevitability of the effect of a given cause. It is the latter, practical, inevitability that we express when we say that something can’t be helped. But the argument assimilates these two forms of necessitation and inevitability.
The more complex form of the argument provided above makes Ryle’s point clear. Principle (I) only makes sense in terms of practical necessitation and inevitability: the past is not in itself logically inevitable. Principle (II) can be read either way: the effect of an unavoidable cause is itself practically inevitable, and the logical consequence of a logically necessary truth is logically necessary. But one cannot mix the two forms of necessitation and inevitability in principle (II)
- one cannot say that a logical consequence of the practically inevitable is itself practically inevitable. For, according to Ryle, events are related as cause and effect, whereas propositions are related as premise and conclusion.
In our expanded argument, steps (A)© and (E’) involve propositions, truth, and logical consequence. But in applying Principle (I) at step (D’) we must speak of the practical inevitability of the truth of a proposition. For Ryle, this is already a mistake, which is compounded by an illegitimate application of Principle (II) at step (F), in which logical necessitation is used to transfer practical inevitability to the present truth of p.
This analysis of the fatalist argument leaves room for further debate. However, the relevance of Ryle’s remarks to the evaluation of the argument is now clear. To bring this out, I have used methods more akin to Soames’s than Ryle’s. But in doing so I have tried to pay sympathetic attention to the details of Ryle’s discussion. Soames, intent on finding in Ryle nothing but conceptual fog, misses Ryle’s insights into an argument of greater complexity than he imagines.
Kripke: While Soames’s treatment of ordinary language philosophy is often marked by a lack of sympathetic reading, the same cannot be said of his chapters on Kripke. Kripke is clearly the hero of Soames’s story. However, one important remark in Naming and Necessity fails to make it into Soames’s books. Soames argues that the failures of ordinary language philosophy show the need for a systematic philosophical theory of meaning to guide the use of meaning analysis in solving philosophical problems. Yet Kripke, introducing the “cluster theory of names” writes: “It really is a nice theory. The only defect I think it has is probably common to all philosophical theories. It’s wrong. You may suspect me of proposing another theory in its place; but I hope not, because I’m sure it’s wrong too if it is a theory.” (Naming and Necessity, 64) Soames never acknowledges this anti-theoretical claim of Kripke’s. Instead, in order to expound Kripke’s arguments, he introduces a “modest theoretical framework” of propositions. (Vol. 2, 373)
For Soames, Kripke’s great achievement was to distinguish the necessary from the a priori and the contingent from the a posteriori. Kripke argued for these distinctions by providing intuitive examples of necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori truths. However, Soames’s theoretical apparatus entails that Kripke’s main examples fail. For example, Soames argues that the proposition Hesperus = Phosphorus is the same proposition as the a priori truth Hesperus = Hesperus, and so not necessary a posteriori. To argue that there are nonetheless examples of both necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori truths, Soames introduces increasingly elaborate theoretical claims. Yet these claims themselves are correspondingly open to philosophical question.
For example, Soames argues that Princeton University has a philosophy department iff actually, Princeton University has a philosophy department is a contingent a priori truth. His argument depends on the following principle: “For any proposition p and possible world-state w, one may know p in w on the basis of evidence e iff in w, one may know, of w, that it is a world-state in which p is true, on the basis of that same evidence e.” (Vol. 2, 418) Soames admits of possible counterexamples to the right-to-left direction of this principle, but points out that he only requires the left-to-right direction, which he thinks is unassailable. (Vol. 2, 421, fn. 20) However, this half of the principle is equally debatable. In the actual world-state, I know that I am 47 years old. But do I know, of the actual world-state, that it is a world-state in which I am 47 years old? In order to know this, I need to know which world-state is the actual world-state. Soames thinks that "the agent can use the demonstrative this world-state" to pick out the actual world-state, “with the understanding that it refers to the world-state he directly experiences.” (Vol. 2, 421, fn. 20) This response makes sense if world-states are conceived of as Lewisian possible worlds, concrete alternative universes, one of which I inhabit and can ostend. Soames, however, rejects this conception. For him, possible worlds are “ways the world could be.” To fix a determinate world-state, it is necessary to determine what is true in that world-state. But using a demonstrative to pick out “this world-state” seems to be an empty gesture, tantamount to “the world-state in which all that is true is true.” By virtue of knowing that I am 47 years old, I know that the world-state in which all that is true, is true, is a world-state in which I am 47 years old. But from this one cannot infer knowledge of that world-state, that it is a world-state in which I am 47 years old. Knowledge of that world-state would require knowing all that is true.
Whatever the fate of this particular objection, clearly the elaborate seven-step argument Soames mounts for his example of the contingent a priori bears little resemblance to the breezy yet clear presentation of Kripke’s own examples. Soames, who claims that the anti-theoretical impulse of Wittgenstein and ordinary language philosophy had run its course by the early 60s, cannot own up to the presence of this same impulse in the writings of his philosophical hero. Thus, even in the culminating chapters of his grand narrative, Soames’s intellectual prejudices distort the history that he tells.
I will end this review with a confession. As I read these books, I often found myself persuaded on one or another point, and I could not help admiring the clarity and power of the presentation. Yet I also experienced a growing feeling of irritation and frustration, slipping at times into anger. Perhaps this review displays too much residual irritation, frustration, and even anger. I hope that it also conveys some of the ground for these feelings. I do not want to dissuade anyone from reading these books. There is much to be gained from them. But they should be approached with caution. Soames recommends reading them in conjunction with the primary sources. (Vol. 1, xviii) He is right — the best advice I can offer is to do so, and then form your own opinions.