(Book 1) Philosophy and Animal Life; (Book 2) The Wounded Animal: J. M. Coetzee and the Difficulty of Reality in Literature and Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Stanley Cavell, Cora Diamond, John McDowell, Ian Hacking, and Cary Wolf, Philosophy and Animal Life, Columbia University Press, 2008, 184pp., $24.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231145145.

Stephen Mulhall, The Wounded Animal: J. M. Coetzee and the Difficulty of Reality in Literature and Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2009, 259pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691137377.

Reviewed by Gerald L. Bruns, University of Notre Dame



In 1997 the South African novelist J. M. Coetzee was invited to give the annual Tanner Lectures at Princeton University. His presentations were entitled, “The Philosophers and the Animals” and “The Poets and the Animals,” and were later published as The Lives of Animals (Princeton University Press, 1999), a volume that also included texts by Princeton’s original respondents to Coetzee’s lectures — Peter Singer (a philosopher), Marjorie Garber (a literary critic), Wendy Doniger (an historian of religion), and Barbara Smuts (a primatologist); the philosopher Amy Gutmann provided an introduction. Some of the respondents were brought up short by the fact that Coetzee’s lectures were not really lectures at all but rather a two-part short story about a lecture and a seminar presented by a fictional Australian novelist, Elizabeth Costello, at Appleton College, an imaginary American university. As Coetzee developed it, the subject of Costello’s lecture is our pervasive indifference to the horror of raising and killing animals for food — a blindness Costello compares to the willful ignorance of Nazi death-camps among ordinary Germans and Poles during World War II.

As it happens, Costello’s argument is not so much in behalf of animal rights or vegetarianism as it is a polemic against the support that philosophy, with its genius for categories and distinctions, has always given to our inhumane treatment of non-human creatures. Hers is a bitter critique of reason as a distancing factor that insulates us against animal suffering. After complaints against Aristotle, Aquinas, and Descartes, she cites Thomas Nagel’s famous question, “What is like to be a bat?,” in order to reject his answer that there is no getting inside bat consciousness. Costello thinks Nagel is just withholding himself and his concepts of subjective experience from the bat. She proposes instead something like Keats’s idea of “negative capability,” namely the poet’s ability to inhabit imaginatively the lives of others, whether human or otherwise (a nightingale, for example). For Elizabeth Costello, the mere fact of fiction-writing refutes Nagel’s position: “If I can think my way into the existence of a being who has never existed, then I can think my way into the existence of a bat or a chimpanzee or an oyster, any being with whom I share the substrate of life.” Sharing here means empathy with the “fullness of life” that every creature enjoys. Whether it is embodied in humans or non-humans, this fullness of life is Elizabeth Costello’s definition of the good, and empathy is the requisite of the good life.

But what’s so good about empathy? Coetzee’s question seems to be: What happens to you when you inhabit the lives of animals in this imaginative fashion? The answer is implicit in Costello’s character. She is, to put it mildly, a difficult case. Much the best parts of Coetzee’s story describe the (mostly reasonable but also often comic) responses of the Appleton College faculty to Costello’s lecture, including that of Costello’s daughter-in-law, a philosopher of mind caught in a fit of outrage by everything her mother-in-law says (and is, namely her mother-in-law, but also a novelist apparently incapable of consecutive reasoning). Appleton’s poet-in-residence, who happens to be Jewish, forcibly complains about Costello’s Holocaust analogy (which seems, however, not to disturb anyone else in her audience). A later formal debate between Costello and a genial Appleton philosopher on the question of the animal is a study in cross-purposes. Costello cannot make sense of herself in a culture of argument. But more than this, Costello’s horror of what is done to animals has made her, not just incomprehensible, but painful to others — and to herself as well. The many-sided torment that her incongruity causes her son, a physicist at Appleton, is the narrative that holds Coetzee’s piece together.

As a literary work, The Lives of Animals is interesting, if fairly conventional, but as a work of conceptual provocation it appears to have accomplished something, for now we have two books — a volume of essays by philosophers of considerable eminence, and a lengthy monograph by the philosopher Stephen Mulhall — that address Coetzee’s tale. In general these philosophers not only give the text careful attention, they take up where Coetzee (and the original Princeton cast of respondents) left off, developing further and even multiplying the aporias and disagreements that Elizabeth Costello put into play. Coetzee himself has added to the mix by expanding The Lives of Animals into a novel of sorts, Elizabeth Costello (Penguin Books, 2003), in which his heroine continues her travels, to the dismay of nearly everyone whom she encounters, including a Kafkaesque committee (guardians of rationality in all their severity) who stand athwart the gates of the hereafter. This accumulation of texts and intertexts reads like nothing so much as the case history of a complex system. For which Elizabeth Costello has a well-prepared line: “We understand by immersing ourselves and our intelligence in complexity.”

Philosophy and Animal Life is spearheaded by Cora Diamond’s essay, “The Difficulty of Life and the Difficulty of Philosophy,” in which she reads The Lives of Animals, not as a kind of argument in favor of animal rights, but as a study of “a woman haunted by the horror of what we do to animals. We see her as wounded by this knowledge, this horror, and by the knowledge of how unhaunted others are. The wound marks and isolates her” (p. 46). What kind of knowledge is this, and what can philosophy say about it? Not much, it appears. The difficulty, Diamond says, is that such knowledge “pushes us beyond what we can think. To attempt to think it is to feel one’s thinking come unhinged. Our concepts, our ordinary life with our concepts, pass by this difficulty as if it were not there; the difficulty, if we try to see it, shoulders us out of life, is deadly chilling” (p. 58). Diamond notes that neither the philosophers inside Coetzee’s story, nor those in real life who responded to the Tanner lectures, see any difficulty here. Instead they convert the difficulty of Costello’s experience into a philosophical problem about the moral status of animals — a problem that arguments can allegedly resolve. Diamond, however, seems to take Costello’s side against philosophy as a practice of moral evasion. At all events, for her Costello is a portrait of someone in a condition of undeflected exposure to the world and to others in it — a true realist.

Diamond’s essay is itself a work of some complexity, since much of it is also part of her ongoing engagement with Stanley Cavell’s The Claim of Reason (Oxford Univ. Press, 1979), especially its notorious fourth part, “Between Acknowledgment and Avoidance,” which explores (among other things) the paradoxes of human separateness — for example, that the humanness of another is not something that I know, but rather something for which I am responsible, which is basically what the idea of acknowledgment comes down to. As Cavell says, “Being human is the power to grant being human. Something about flesh and blood elicits this grant from us, and something about flesh and blood can also repel it.” (The Claim of Reason, p. 397). Cavell does not quite extend the limits of acknowledgement to include non-humans (although he worries about the possibility of non-humans assuming human form), but his hand can be seen in Cora Diamond’s famous essay, “Eating Meat and Eating People,” on how we recognize some but not all non-human animals as our “fellow-creatures” (The Realistic Spirit [MIT Press, 1996], pp. 326-34). It is not something we know about our pets, or about the birds and squirrels that we feed, that keeps (most of) us from eating them; it is something about ourselves — our need for or enjoyment of the company of non-human animals. As a vegetarian, Diamond takes this company to include not just dogs and cats but all non-human animals (it is curious, as Barbara Smuts points out, that Elizabeth Costello has little to say about her interest in pets).

In his contribution, “Companionable Thinking,” Cavell wonders what it is about those of us, in which Cavell includes himself, who are carnivores without compunction. It’s not that Elizabeth Costello knows something we don’t; it is rather that her knowledge is “inordinate” — “knowledge whose importunateness can seem excessive in its expression, in contrast to mere or unobtrusive or intellectualized or indifferent or stored knowledge” (p. 95). Elizabeth Costello suffers this knowledge all the more deeply because of what she takes to be her own complicity in the fate of non-human animals, namely that she wears leather shoes and carries a leather handbag. One lesson Cavell draws from this seems to be that a human life that was fully justified — above reproach in Rawls’s famous formulation — would be something other than human. He writes: “I remain too impressed with Freud’s vision of the human animal’s compromise with existence — the defense or deflection of our ego in knowledge of ourselves from what there is to know about ourselves — to suppose that a human life can get itself without residue into the clear” (p. 121). Our relation to the difficulty of life is in a state of ongoing negotiation, without whose compromises our humanity would come (as it does for Elizabeth Costello) at great cost to itself. One might take this to mean that “inordinate knowledge” is the stuff of tragedy, whereas side-stepping, hedging, and splitting the difference are what keep the roguish heroes of comedy on their feet. Whether this amounts to a tacit defense of philosophy, with its categories and distinctions, I’ll leave for others to decide. Students of Cavell’s work will naturally want to consult his Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism (University of Chicago Press, 1990), where perfectionism is not perfectibility but is rather the reason why the Emersonian is by nature dissatisfied and unsatisfiable, perpetually goaded by an open-ended call to change his or her life. One would think that perfectionism would be one of the difficulties of life, but for Cavell it seems to be the thing that makes life purposeful and even interesting.

John McDowell, in his brief “Comments on Stanley Cavell’s ‘Companionable Thinking’,” thinks that “Cavell’s response [to Diamond’s essay] does not do justice to the wonderful way Diamond has found to throw light on Cavellian themes” (p. 128) — for example, the theme of human separateness, and specifically the horror of “inexpressiveness” (The Claim of Reason, p. 474). Our experience of belonging with human others, and hence of being human, is what is “unhinged” when words fail us, as they do Elizabeth Costello, a “wounded animal” whose wound consists precisely in the loss of that which is said to distinguish us from non-human creatures. (She likens herself to the ape in Kafka’s “Report to the Academy,” but ironically Kafka’s “Red Peter” taught himself to speak at least as well as any cultivated European, which in his opinion is not saying much.) Meanwhile Cary Wolfe’s useful introduction to Philosophy and Animal Life is balanced by Ian Hacking’s concluding remarks — a series of random but intriguing notes on the proceedings, including an observation that in breeding turkeys for food (using artificial insemination and force-feeding) we have produced a species of faux-turkeys who, being so fat, can neither walk nor copulate with turkey hens. To which he adds: “There is something wrong, morally lacking (I feel) with someone who is not … appalled by the way we have bred turkeys out of their turkeyness” (p. 151). Part of the difficulty of Elizabeth Costello is evidently the way she can get under a philosopher’s skin.

Stephen Mulhall’s The Wounded Animal is an extended and detailed give and take with this entire complex system — The Lives of Animals, Philosophy and Animal Life, and Coetzee’s Elizabeth Costello. The book is in two parts. The first, devoted to The Lives of Animals and the various philosophical responses to it, is most importantly an attempt to enlarge our view of what counts as a philosophical argument. Mulhall disagrees with the view that Elizabeth Costello is out of her element in a culture of argument, because hers are “forms of discourse that philosophy need have no qualms about admitting as modes of thought or ways of reflecting about the world, hence as possible ways of meeting its own distinctive burden — that of acknowledging the claims of reason” (p. 77). To appreciate this possibility we need to understand more fully what it means to philosophize by way of examples, a form of thinking traditionally credited to Wittgenstein, and of which both Cavell and Diamond are major exemplars. Mulhall’s claim is that examples are

the pivot of moral thought in themselves: attention to them is not a means of getting somewhere, but an end in itself … . Consequently, these examples must not be schematic or sketchy, but rather detailed, elaborate, and fully worked out; and it is natural therefore to derive them from the domain of literature, and in particular from classics in the genres of the novel and short stories (p. 11).

Philosophy needs to be weaned away from its reliance on thought-experiments, which proceed by eliminating the particulars of which, among other things, the difficulties of life are constituted.

In addition to his reading of Elizabeth Costello and her difficulties, Mulhall takes up each of her respondents, real and fictional, with whom his agreements and disagreements are often quite subtle, but mainly he is interested in how far they are willing to read The Lives of Animals as a work that tests — and extends — the limits of philosophical thinking. In addition he includes a fugitive chapter on Martin Heidegger’s remarks on non-human animals, including Heidegger’s idea that our relation with domestic animals is a complex form of mitsein — they are with us but not one of us, nor are we one of them, except perhaps when Dasein in the grip of boredom slips into something like the poverty of the worldless animal. More interesting perhaps is Mulhall’s brief engagement with the primatologist Barbara Smuts, who spent her career living among apes and chimpanzees, and who doesn’t hesitate to regard many of these creatures not just as individuals but as persons, even as they come to regard her as one of their own. Mulhall thinks Smuts crosses an anthropomorphic line in attributing personhood to primates; he prefers the philosopher (and animal trainer) Vickie Hearne’s straightforward poetic metaphorization of her dogs. But suppose one took up some version of Stanley Cavell’s line, that our relation to others is not one of knowing but of acknowledgment, where what is at issue is not the endowments primates may or may not have but rather the responsibility I take on when living among them — feeling called upon, as Barbara Smuts did, to accept them as persons, creatures having moral claims on our ability to respond to them with care and affection, not to say empathy — in any event not holding them at a distance. The apes after all did not respond to her as a primatologist doing field work but as a fellow creature.

In the second part of The Wounded Animal Mulhall gives us a careful study of Coetzee’s Elizabeth Costello, which is an odd assortment of fictions that Coetzee identifies as “lessons.” Mulhall starts out by accepting that Elizabeth Costello is a work of literary realism, but a modernist rather than what we might think of as a traditional nineteenth-century realism that tries to capture the empirical look and feel of everyday existence. Oddly Mulhall draws his conception of modernism from the art historian, Michael Fried, whose interests are in painting rather than in literature. Fried is someone whom I would call a conservative theorist for whom the modernist foregrounds the artifice of his or her work without (as Mulhall puts it) giving up on the idea that the work “gives us access to important and valuable truths about the human experience of the world” (p. 159). A more radical modernist would be the artist whom Adorno takes up in his Aesthetic Theory, namely someone whose aim is “to make things of which we do not know what they are” (trans. Robert Huillot-Kentor [Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997], p. 114). Coetzee is conservative in the sense that language for him remains a form of mediation; the materiality of his language is never really part of the reader’s experience as it is in writers like James Joyce and Samuel Beckett, not to mention most poets since Stéphane Mallarmé (“My dear Degas, one does not make poems with ideas but with words”). However, like Kafka (although Brecht would be a better example) Coetzee breaks the realistic frame of the fiction, particularly in Elizabeth Costello, sufficiently to defeat our absorption in it, since what he is after is (like Brecht) to put us in a critical frame of mind.

In general, however, Mulhall is rather more interested in the thematic than the formal aspects of Coetzee’s fiction, and among the most interesting of these is the question of embodiment. In The Claim of Reason (pp. 397-98) Cavell remarks that I neither have nor am in my body. My body (or, as Cavell sometimes puts it, my flesh) is just what I am. Elizabeth Costello seems to share this way of thinking. Disembodied concepts and arguments — concepts and arguments detached or detachable from the one who professes them — are for her without force. Likewise the writing of fiction is a matter of inhabiting not just lives and experiences but the bodies of non-existent beings. She goes so far as to claim that she can imagine herself as a corpse. But perhaps most important it is Costello’s (inordinate) experience of her own body — of being and not just having her aging body — that is the crucial source of her feeling for non-human animals, particularly those who are made to suffer and die instead of being treated as good in themselves and kept out of harm’s way. Here is where Cavell’s substitution of the word “flesh” for “body” is worth some reflection. The body (soma) is a Greek (and heroic) concept: it implies strength, beauty, and imperviousness to suffering; flesh meanwhile is a biblical concept that implies weakness and vulnerability, corpulence and emaciation, and finally decay and death. Flesh is for eating and being eaten. Its distinctive feature is the wound which, perhaps until now with the volumes we have here, does not appear to have ever been a subject for philosophy.