(Book 1) Public Philosophy in a New Key, Volume I: Democracy and Civic Freedom; (Book 2) Public Philosophy in a New Key, Volume II: Imperialism and Civic Freedom

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James Tully, Public Philosophy in a New Key, Volume I: Democracy and Civic Freedom, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 360pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521728799;

James Tully, Public Philosophy in a New Key, Volume II: Imperialism and Civic Freedom, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 355pp., $29.99 (pbk), 9780521728805.

Reviewed by Marco Iorio, Alfried Krupp Wissenschaftskolleg Greifswald



These two volumes contain eighteen articles James Tully published between 1989 and 2008 (only the last chapter of volume II is new). With this collection Tully claims to present a new approach to the study of politics. First, the approach is public insofar as it understands its civic task to be addressing public affairs. Second, this has to be done by entering into dialogues with those citizens who are engaged in struggles against prevailing forms of oppression, injustice, inequality and exploitation. One aim of such dialogues is to give advice to politically engaged citizens by means of historical and critical studies of the practices and circumstances in which their struggles take place. At the same time the public philosopher seeks to learn from the citizens about the successes and failures of their civic struggles in order to improve her historical and critical reflections. Accordingly, Tully takes the relationship between philosophy and political practice to be reciprocal. He views himself not only as an academic researcher but also as a member of the demos. Further, he regards every reflective and engaged citizen as a public philosopher. This reciprocal understanding is what Tully declares to be the new key in which his public philosophy is composed.

To my mind, however, what Tully presents is not really a new approach to the study of politics. Rather, it is a new description of what political philosophy has been ever since its beginnings two and a half millennia ago. Perhaps the description Tully offers is better than what he mistakenly takes to be alternative approaches to doing political philosophy. But in fact there are no such alternative approaches. There are only alternative descriptions and, accordingly, alternative understandings (including misunderstandings) of what a political philosopher is doing. Of course philosophers are living members of their social and political communities. Philosopher stand in communicative interaction with other academics as well as non-academic citizens. And while philosophers are influenced by these interactions, they are at the same time influencing their academic and non-academic surroundings. There can’t be anything new about these basic facts of social reality.

Additionally, Tully locates himself in the tradition of critical theory. This means that he regards neither knowledge, nor understanding, nor a defensible theory as the primary aim of his research. Rather, the primary goal of doing philosophy is liberation from unjust and oppressive circumstances, which is achieved by coming to see that these circumstances have a history, are therefore contingent, and can hence be changed in the future by political action. In other words, knowledge, theory and political philosophy are just means to the end of liberation and the improvement of civic freedom, i.e. political and social freedom of political animals called citizens. Again, it is dubitable whether this understanding of political philosophy is a characteristic feature of a certain tradition. Most plausibly, political philosophy has nearly always been at the bottom concerned with the goals Tully emphasizes. Thus, it has arguably been critical theory in the relevant sense of the term right from the start. This may be true in spite of several misunderstandings (even by political philosophers themselves) of what political philosophers are doing.

An unpleasant side-effect of Tully’s self-understanding as a critical theorist is his abundant and uncritical use of the terms ‘critical’ and ‘critically’, which show up in nearly every sentence of the two volumes (‘critical light’, ‘critical comparison’, ‘critical attitude’, ‘critical ability’, ‘critical activity’, ‘critical ethos’, ‘critical survey’, ‘critical method’, ‘critical studies’, ‘critical dialogue’, ‘critical understanding’, ‘to understand critically’, to relate critically’ are just some examples). The minor problem with the constant use of the term is that by the end of the eighteen papers the reader simply cannot stand it anymore. The more serious problem is that if everything can have the property of being critical, it becomes hard to grasp what this property consists in and what the corresponding terms are supposed to mean. Therefore, I would like to opt for a moratorium. Forget about critical understanding for a while. In the meantime, understanding may be enough.

But these, of course, are minor points. If we ignore Tully’s claim to present a new approach to the study of politics and connive at his style of presentation for the time being, we can now turn to the philosophically interesting contents of his papers. In his introduction to the two volumes Tully divides the eighteen articles into two groups. The first group consists of the first three chapters of volume I. Here, Tully’s understanding of political theory as public philosophy is introduced by locating his project in the tradition of Wittgenstein, Foucault, and the Cambridge School around Skinner and Pocock. These three articles develop the methodological background for the rest of the papers, which Tully calls ‘case studies’.

The papers of the first group, i.e., part 1 of volume I, elucidate the concept of public philosophy by means of four defining characteristics. First, public philosophy stresses the primacy of practice insofar as it views itself as a philosophical reflection on those practices of governance that are experienced as oppressive by the governed. By studying the history of such practices and the concepts that are used to describe, discuss and negotiate these practices, the public philosopher aims to assist the oppressed in their struggle for a better, i.e., less oppressive, mode of governance. This aim, according to Tully, is not reached by the development of normative theories of justice, equality or democracy that could be regarded as solutions to the political problems that the oppressed have with their masters. Rather — and this is the second characteristic — the aim is reached by giving historically inspired redescriptions of the contested practice and its actually discussed solutions, which help the oppressed to see the contingent and therefore transformable nature of their political situation.

The third defining characteristic Tully mentions is just an elaboration of the second. The objective at which the public philosopher aims is reached in two steps. The first step is an analysis of the practice and the language citizens use to talk about a given practice. This analysis brings to light what these people (mistakenly) take for granted and (mistakenly) regard as necessary. It brings to light, in other words, the limits of their intellectual horizon. The second step delivers the genealogy of the practice and the established ways of talking about it. On Tully’s view, this somehow creates the ability of the oppressed to think about new solutions to their political problems.

The last of the four defining characteristics of public philosophy is its dialogical nature. Public philosophers should not understand their aim to be offering the oppressed final solutions are based on their historical and genealogical studies. Rather, they make contributions to a discussion that is going on among citizens, including themselves among the citizens. Accordingly, they are prepared to listen to the contributions of non-academic participants and to take those contributions as starting points for their further research. In principle there is no punch line in such discussions. Every change of political attitude, political activity or the structure of political practice is understood to be provisional. In certain respects what is going on is some kind of continuous experiment that is oriented at civic freedom as a regulative idea.

Part 2 of volume I consists of three papers in which Tully focuses on civic freedom and the problem of recognition of individuals and (minority) communities especially in multinational democracies. I think it is no accident that his interlocutors in these papers are not his non-academic contemporaries or political activists struggling against oppressive practices of government but rather philosophers like Hannah Arendt, Richard Rorty, Jürgen Habermas and Charles Taylor. As soon as Tully stops talking about philosophy and starts doing philosophy he seems to forget about his programmatic declarations in the first part of volume I. In fact, it may be a good idea to do so.

Volume I, part 3 consists of two papers in which Tully deals with the struggles of Indigenous peoples for recognition in contemporary multinational democracies and the history of colonisation and decolonisation. These two chapters, which are based on Tully’s work for the Canadian Royal Commission on Aboriginal Peoples from 1991 to 1995, may be the best and most informative part of the two volumes. However, it is somewhat disappointing that the author does not keep the promise he articulates in the introduction to chapter 8. Instead of delivering a survey of political theories that have been used to legitimatize colonial politics, the author merely talks about the history of colonisation. The announced survey is simply missing.

The concluding chapter nine of volume I returns to the topic of recognition of individuals and communities in political associations of any kind. Here Tully presents an optimistic view of the recent history of struggles for recognition that he interprets as a learning process. His optimism is based on the plausible assumption that definitive and stable reconciliations of such struggles should not be expected. Rather, these struggles have to be accepted as persistent traits of political communities. This, of course, does not deny the possibility of constant improvements. Therefore the important task is to install political institutions that allow the members of the community to call present (necessarily imperfect) norms of recognition into question on the one hand and negotiate fairly without the use of violence in order to improve their situation on the other. This message, of course, is not new but is very important and worth repeating every once in a while.

The nine chapters of volume II deal with global politics, international relationships of inequality, dependency and exploitation as well as imperialism and democratic integration in the European Union. Part 1 consists of three articles. The first is a criticism of Kant’s cosmopolitanism, the federalistic implications of which deliver the theoretical background not only for the European Union and the United States but also for the United Nations and other supranational organisations. The cosmopolitan paradigm is criticized mainly for its imperialistic and Eurocentric nature. On Tully’s view, it has to be replaced by bringing in more non-Western elements with the aim of formulating a more pluralistic conception of cosmopolitanism. Unfortunately, Tully leaves open the question of what such an alternative conception could look like. The statement that a better version of cosmopolitanism should be less imperialistic and more pluralistic is much too scanty to inspire political orientation, action and institution building.

The second chapter is an examination of several theories of globalisation, cosmopolitan democracy and global governance with the target of sketching some forms of democracy that enhance liberty and civic freedom in the present age of globalisation. However, referring to Hegel’s metaphor of the owl of Minerva, Tully stresses his conviction that there cannot be a detailed social and political theory of the present, let alone the future. Moreover, in keeping with his pluralistic, anti-imperialistic attitude, Tully stresses the importance of accepting the fact that there is no single model for all democratically organized political societies. Together these two features explain why Tully’s sketch of freedom-enhancing forms of democracy that are compatible with the premises of globalisation is indeed very sketchy. The author simply fails to give clear contours to his position. Tully’s claim that his scanty way of writing about political matters could be the “distinctive political philosophy in the twenty-first century” thus raises doubts (p. 72). I would think that a philosophy that refrains from formulating any position sufficiently substantial to argue about is of no use whatsoever — neither in theory nor in political practice.

Chapter three deals with environmental movements and sketches an ethics of ecological politics. Chapter four discusses some theories of global justice and international law with the intention of showing, again, that an alternative would be better. What this alternative is supposed to look like, again, remains an open question.

The three chapters of part 2 are aimed at showing that five hundred years of Western imperialism are still with us and that imperialistic politics have survived the age of decolonisation. This can be seen with respect to international relations (chap. 5), the revolution of communication through the internet (chap. 6), and the imperial role of the Western model of constitutional democracy (chap. 7).

Volume II concludes with two articles that pretend to answer the question what we as citizens and subjects of imperial relationships can do to transform these into more democratic and anti-imperial relationships. In chapter 8 Tully argues that the citizenry of the European Union have already gained the lead in finding new democratic modes in dealing with immigration, economical alternatives and countries in the global South. That is really good news. One would like to hear more about these new democratic modes. Chapter nine concludes volume II by articulating some speculations about a possible form of local and global citizenship that Tully calls ‘glocal’. This glocal citizenship, the reader is told, “has the capacity to overcome the imperialism of the present age and bring a democratic world into being” (p. 243).

As may already have become clear, I am not happy with these two volumes of papers by one of the most distinguished political philosophers of our present. Having read the eighteen articles the reader is very well informed about Tully’s post-modernist meta-philosophical attitudes with respect to the study of political matters. About these matters, however, the reader does not know very much he didn’t know before. Tully’s attitudes can be summarized as the denial to venture political and philosophical theories based on the conviction that the political philosopher of the twenty-first century has to be modest and should not pretend to deliver a view from nowhere standing above his fellow citizens. I can accept the spirit of this position. But to my mind, once we have become clear about the relationship between political philosophy and the realities of political affairs it is somewhat boring and not at all fruitful to reflect on this relation over and over again. Once we have an advanced understanding of this relation, and of the reasons for the political philosopher to be modest, we can go back to what a philosopher is supposed to do: philosophize — try to produce theoretical insights with respect to practical and theoretical matters. There cannot be substantial philosophy that is not fond of theory.