Born Free and Equal?: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Nature of Discrimination

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Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, Born Free and Equal?: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Nature of Discrimination, Oxford University Press, 2014, 317pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199796113.

Reviewed by Deborah Hellman, University of Virginia


This book provides a closely argued, careful account of what discrimination is and what makes it wrong. It is a combination of meticulous dissection of the concept of discrimination, provocative argument for a harm-based foundation for the wrongfulness of discrimination, and insightful and fair critique of the dominant competing accounts. In a relatively new field of scholarship focused on thinking philosophically about discrimination, Lippert-Rasmussen’s contribution stands out for its comprehensiveness, its detail and its high quality.

The book is divided into three parts. Part I provides a conceptual analysis of discrimination, including both direct and indirect discrimination (often called disparate treatment and disparate impact discrimination by U.S. courts and legal scholars) as well as statistical discrimination. Part II moves from the conceptual to the normative. It contains three chapters, one each devoted to analyzing and critiquing mental state-based accounts (Chapter 4) and objective-meaning-accounts (Chapter 5) of the wrongness of discrimination. Its final chapter (Chapter 6) provides Lippert-Rasmussen’s articulation and argument in favor of his preferred version of a harm-based account. Lastly, Part III of the book focuses on what one ought to do about discrimination. Its 5 chapters each looks at a specific remedial approach, e.g, for achieving proportional representation (Chapter 7), considering how one ought to understand and evaluate so-called “reaction qualifications”, a subtopic within discrimination (Chapter 9) and dealing with a public policy issue like racial profiling in policing (Chapter 11).

While there are competing accounts of what makes discrimination wrong -- those Lippert-Rasmussen critiques as well as others -- I know of no other developed analysis of what discrimination is. Part I thus provides an important contribution to the field. It takes up a challenging task. On the one hand, we must have a sense of what discrimination is in order to investigate what makes it wrong, when it is wrong. On the other hand, when people disagree about whether some practice, policy or action is wrongful discrimination, this disagreement can often be recast as a disagreement about whether it is discrimination at all. For example, defenders of affirmative action sometimes argue that preferences for minority applicants to universities or jobs are permissible discrimination (a meaning captured by the term “positive discrimination”) and other times contend that it is not discrimination at all (thus the use of the term “affirmative action,” which calls up values of compensation or integration).

Lippert-Rasmussen’s definition of discrimination has several key features in virtue of which it is provocative but controversial. First, according to Lippert-Rasmussen, discrimination is “essentially comparative.” (p. 16) X must treat Y worse than X treats Z. Second, discrimination involves “disadvantageous treatment.” (p. 18) Third, to be discrimination, X must treat Y worse than Z because Y has (or X believes that Y has) a property P that is the property of “being a member of a socially salient group.” (26). In other words, if an employer refuses to hire Jane because Jane has freckles and instead hires John, this is not a form of discrimination according to this definition. However, if the employer refuses to hire Jane because she is a woman and instead hires John, this is discrimination.

What is troubling about this as a conception of discrimination is the fact that Lippert-Rasmussen explicitly rejects a moralized conception of discrimination (24-5), and so this definition is not meant to depend on a theory of what makes discrimination wrong. And yet it is hard to see on what basis he is entitled to rule out differentiation on the basis of traits that are not socially salient without relying on a normative account. While it is possible to use the term “discrimination” in a non-moralized way (though Lippert-Rasmussen does think instances of discrimination are at least prima facie wrong), the concept of discrimination may be an “interpretive concept” -- to use Ronald Dworkin’s term (Justice For Hedgehogs Harvard University Press, 2011, 6-7). While we may have roughly the same practices and examples in mind when we talk about discrimination, we disagree quite fundamentally about the values instantiated in prohibitions on discrimination. Therefore practices like affirmative action are central cases of discrimination on some accounts and clearly not discrimination on others. If this is right, the aim of the Part I may simply not be possible to achieve. If the goal is to first fix our understanding of what discrimination is before we go on to analyze what makes it wrong, this approach may get the order of analysis backwards. Perhaps we ought to look at all those practices and examples that are plausibly described as discrimination, understood liberally. Then, using instances that are widely understood as paradigm cases (racial segregation of public institutions in the United States prior to the 1960’s for example), we develop an account of what makes discrimination wrong. This normative account could then be turned back onto the data set of possible instances of discrimination to reveal which instances really are cases of discrimination and which are not.

However, the claim that discrimination is an interpretive concept in this way is clearly itself controversial and would require more argument than space allows. Lippert-Rasmussen’s careful and nuanced analysis of the concept of discrimination articulates a clear and forceful position that those who disagree with it will need to address.

Part II’s analysis of what makes discrimination wrong makes two important contributions. First, it deftly critiques what Lippert-Rasmussen takes to be the two dominant answers to this question -- that discrimination is wrong when it is based on morally problematic intentions or false beliefs and that discrimination is wrong when its objective meaning is morally objectionable. (Full disclosure: my own view is one of the objective meaning accounts that Lippert-Rasmussen criticizes in depth.)

The motivating idea behind mental-state-based accounts is the fact that many cases of discrimination occur in contexts in which the actor has discretion about how to act. A city has no obligation to fund and maintain public pools. However, if the city closes the public pools because its officials refuse to operate them on an integrated basis, this action constitutes discrimination. A university has wide discretion about whom to admit. It can favor well-rounded students with good grades in all subjects or it can prefer those students with exceptional talent in one area who are weak in others. If however, it chooses a well-rounded student not because the school admissions officials think well-roundedness is important but instead because she is white and the student with the alternative set of qualifications is a racial minority, this is problematic.

In discussing mental-state-based accounts, Lippert-Rasmussen takes Larry Alexander as his main target. He carefully analyzes Alexander’s view, suggesting possible versions and variations on it. His treatment is fair and insightful. While the analysis is rich and cannot be quickly recapped, Lippert-Rasmussen has two main lines of critique. First, he asks that if we think that there is something intrinsically wrong with treating people differently on the basis of false beliefs about their relative moral worth, why not also on the basis of false beliefs about their relative moral deservingness or other false beliefs related to equality. Second, he provides examples in which various actors have false beliefs about the lesser moral worth of the subjects of discrimination, but these false beliefs sometimes cause them to act in particular ways and sometimes don’t. He shows that we are inclined to judge the actions of two individuals the same regardless of the beliefs they hold and the ways in which these beliefs cause or don’t cause their actions.

Lippert-Rasmussen follows a similar approach in exposing the problems with objective meaning accounts -- first highlighting ambiguities and offering friendly amendments, then using examples meant to expose cases that cannot be explained by that account. Here his targets are my own view and that of Thomas Scanlon. These accounts ground the wrong of discrimination in the meaning expressed by such actions. It is because segregation marked blacks as inferior that it was wrongful discrimination. This approach seems especially well-suited to capture the complaint of critics of laws that limit marriage to opposite-sex couples. Because some states provide the same rights and responsibilities to same-sex and opposite-sex couples while refusing to recognize the former as “marriages,” critics object that the state sends a message that same-sex couples are inferior. According to the objective meaning accounts of wrongful discrimination, laws limiting marriage to opposite-sex couples wrongfully discriminate precisely because of the meaning expressed by such laws.

Lippert-Rasmussen argues against this sort of approach along a number of dimensions, some of which I found more successful than others. In one part I found particularly helpful, he presses on the ambiguity in my account regarding what exactly must be expressed for the action to constitute wrongful discrimination. If an act must express that someone is not of equal moral worth, this requirement may turn out to be too demanding, as many acts of discrimination express something negative without expressing that one person is of lesser moral worth than another. Marriage laws are a good example. While they may express that the unions of gay couples are inferior, it is probably fair to say that they don’t express that gay people are of lesser moral worth as people. But, as Lippert-Rasmussen points out, if the content of what is expressed need not be that a person is of lesser moral worth, then my account will not rest on an uncontroversial moral principle in the way I claim. This is an insightful critique.

In the last chapter of Part II, Lippert-Rasmussen defends harm-based accounts of wrongful discrimination. On this view, discrimination is wrong, when it is, because of the harm it causes. On this view, there isn’t a distinctive wrong of discrimination. Of course, anyone who holds a form of consequentialism is unlikely to see this as a problem and Lippert-Rasmussen rightly points out that consequentialists like him can surely recognize the specific types of harm that discrimination usually causes, like loss of opportunity and stigma. Within harm-based accounts, Lippert-Rasmussen defends a particular form -- a desert, prioritarian account that weighs the interests of the less well-off more heavily than the better off and weighs benefits to the deserving more heavily than to the undeserving. This is a view in line with that of Richard Arneson, who has also applied it to discrimination, but not as comprehensively or with as much detail as does Lippert-Rasmussen. In my view, up to now, harm-based accounts of what makes discrimination wrong have not gotten as much attention as have other accounts. With the publication of this book, that will surely change.

Having analyzed what discrimination is and what makes it wrong, Part III asks what we ought to do about it. In doing so, Lippert-Rasmussen takes on proportional representation, discrimination in punishment, reaction qualifications, discrimination in the private sphere and racial profiling. While each chapter provides a helpful and characteristically detailed and nuanced analysis of its topic, this part could have been better integrated into the book as a whole if he had used the opportunity to explore why his preferred harm-based account could better handle the issue considered in the particular chapter than either a mental state-based or objective meaning account.

Born Free and Equal? is a dense and demanding book, but it is well-worth the effort. It is filled with well-chosen examples that press the reader to examine her intuitions about which cases constitute discrimination and why. It is technical at times but always accessible. While scholarship about discrimination often has focused on examples drawn from the writer’s own country’s specific history and legal system and has been aimed at that parochial audience, Born Free and Equal? easily crosses national boundaries, draws examples and experiences from many contexts and cultures, both real and imagined, and speaks to any reader interested in the important philosophical, legal and political question of what discrimination is and what makes it wrong.