Bound: Essays on Free Will and Responsibility

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Shaun Nichols, Bound: Essays on Free Will and Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2015, 188pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199291847.

Reviewed by Manuel R. Vargas, University of San Francisco


Shaun Nichols offers a provocative and original approach to the problem of free will. Drawing from psychology, experimental philosophy, and traditional philosophical treatments, Nichols' shows how many of the moral and metaphysical matters surrounding free will and moral responsibility are not what they seem. In particular, he finds that familiar metaphysical and moral debates turn on failures to appreciate the psychological origins of our intuitions and moral life. Although the subtitle may suggest a collection of loosely connected essays, the book is a sustained and systematic account of two interconnected issues: (1) the origins and status of intuitions at play in debates about free will, and (2) the moral and psychological bases of our moral responsibility attitudes and practices.

Nichols defends a form of revisionism about free will and moral responsibility. He thinks that our considered philosophical view should be one that repudiates important aspects of ordinary thinking about freedom and responsibility. Nevertheless, the core of our responsibility practices -- including retributive attitudes and ordinary blame -- remain in good standing and are compatible with determinism. Ascriptions of responsibility are a somewhat more complicated matter, however, as Nichols is interestingly pluralist about whether people are responsible.

Nichols' account unfolds in three stages. The first stage is descriptive, akin to "cognitive anthropology" (7). The goal is to suss out folk intuitions about agency and responsibility as we find them, prior to philosophical refinement. The second stage is concerned with substantive questions arising from the descriptive project. This stage aims to evaluate folk commitments, considering whether ordinary notions of freedom and responsibility are justified or correct. The third part of the account is prescriptive. It considers whether we should preserve, revise, or eliminate our responsibility practices.

On the matter of the descriptive project, Nichols' view is that the problem of free will arises because of two natural ways we have for thinking about ourselves. Drawing from experimental work and philosophical considerations, Nichols argues that we have "an explanatory compulsion," one in which every action or event must have a cause. This explanatory compulsion tends to favor deterministic explanations and lends itself to seeing human action as a causal product of prior events. However, this explanatory compulsion interacts with a distinctive way of thinking about the sources of our own actions. In the first-personal cases, we cannot identify causal origins of our action, and (with some important conditions I will elide) he thinks we take this as evidence that our actions do not have deterministic causes. Thus, we are left with a conflict between our deterministically-inclined explanatory compulsion and a strong "indeterminist intuition" about our own actions. From these seeds, the philosophical problem of free will blooms.

Nichols actually offers two different models for the origin of the indeterminist explanation. By his lights they both share a defect that leads to the same diagnosis in the substantive portion of his account. Nichols concludes that incompatibilist folk notions are not justified. Unlike standard arguments against libertarianism, which tend to focus on the coherence of the view, its empirical plausibility, or its purportedly extravagant metaphysical costs, Nichols provides a debunking explanation of the indeterminist intuition that gives rise to philosophical theorizing on behalf of libertarianism. The heart of the debunking argument is that our introspection is a flawed guide to the causal factors involved in our decision making. Given that we are unjustified in inferring from introspection that choice is indeterminist, "our intuition of indeterminism counts for nothing" (53).

With respect to the prescriptive project, Nichols argues that we should abandon our commitment to incompatibilism about free will and that we can do so without affecting other aspects of our thinking about agency and responsibility. For moral and pragmatic reasons, the attitudes and practices characteristic of responsibility should be retained (chapter 6 and 7). However, the seemingly entangled threads of our incompatibilist folk thinking can be, for the most part, cleanly severed from those practices (this is the argument of chapter 4). Nevertheless, there will be times, Nichols thinks, when it will be useful to remind ourselves that we lack the form of agency picked out by some threads of our folk thinking and that some conventional ways of talking about free will are literally false (165-6).

There is a good deal that is appealing about Nichols' account. In what follows, I focus on some of its more distinctive contributions.

An influential line of argument against one form of compatibilism, or the thesis that moral responsibility is compatible with determinism, turns on manipulation cases. Although the details vary, the core idea is that there is widespread agreement that we do not hold accountable agents who are completely and systematically manipulated by others. The standard shape of manipulation arguments for incompatibilism moves from this fact to the idea that such cases are not suitably different from one's actions being a product of the causal order. Thus, if we think that systematically manipulated agents are not responsible, then we should think agents whose actions are entirely a product of a deterministic causal order are not responsible either.

Nichols, drawing on the work of Jonathan Phillips and Alex Shaw, argues that in making responsibility ascriptions in manipulation cases, what people are really sensitive to is the presence of a manipulating agent (91-3). Thus, a standard compatibilist response to manipulation cases -- namely, that agent manipulators are different from causes of other sorts, and this is what explains the absence of responsibility in manipulation cases -- appears to reflect the contours of ordinary thought. In contrast, the incompatibilist's ambition to generalize from manipulation cases trades on a failure to appreciate that our intuitions are indeed tracking the presence of an agent doing the manipulating.

None of this shows that incompatibilists cannot argue from manipulation cases on other bases. However, Nichols is concerned to show that even though incompatibilist intuitions are widespread, the roots of those intuitions are relatively limited and isolated. Importantly, they do not appear to support many of the familiar philosophical moves that motivate incompatibilists.

Nichols endeavors to take seriously the origins of incompatibilism in ordinary moral thinking. Despite his careful consideration of how indeterminist intuitions might have deep roots in our psychology, my suspicion is that many libertarians about free will (i.e., those who think that we have free will and that it is incompatible with the thesis of determinism) will feel that libertarianism has been given short shrift. After all, Nichols offers no direct objection to the tenability of libertarianism. Instead, his path is to impugn libertarianism's intuitional roots in our psychology. So, for any libertarian who grounds her view in considerations independent of first-personal indeterminist intuitions, the best that Nichols' approach can provide is a glancing blow to the sort of view she favors.

There are at least two things to be said on behalf of Nichols' approach with respect to libertarianism. First, the details of the debunking strategy and the accompanying argument for the relative isolation of incompatibilist intuitions are certainly worth the attention of incompatibilists. Nichols offers a subtle and principled account of debunking arguments and when they can and cannot succeed (see chapter 5). He allows that there are some cases -- including those involving our retributive attitudes -- in which intuitions require no further justification. Nevertheless, if Nichols' debunking account of libertarian intuitions is correct, then the onus is on the libertarian to explain why we should be in the business of vindicating indeterminist intuitions at all.

Second, given widespread philosophical skepticism about libertarianism, and given the prominent role that incompatibilism more generally plays in the dialectic about free will, it is hardly unreasonable to focus one's attentions, as Nichols does, on what emerges from this conjunction of these views. No doubt these considerations will leave libertarians unmoved, but Nichols' interest here is less in grappling with the prospects for libertarianism than it is in considering whether eliminativism about free will and moral responsibility is well motivated.

An important part of Nichols project (especially chapter 3) consists in illuminating a variety of broadly "preservationist" approaches. These seek to show that there is some warrant for preserving our beliefs, practices, or dispositions implicated in free will. In particular, what Nichols successfully shows is that we can accept an error theory about our indeterminist intuitions without thereby abandoning the possibility of a preservationist view about free will and moral responsibility.

As Nichols notes, one standard way to respond to error theories in a wide variety of domains is to opt for broadly revisionist alternatives. For example, in the face of doubts about the empirical credentials of a traditional biological conception of race, one might insist that races exist but that they are socially constructed in a way that folk thinking tends not to appreciate. Similarly, if one thinks that nothing in the world corresponds to all the roles ascribed to beliefs and desires, one might be an eliminativist, but one might also adopt a revisionist refinement of each attitude. The same goes for free will and moral responsibility. That is, one might allow that folk convictions about free will and moral responsibility depend on some kind of error, but one can still hold that people can be free and morally responsible, just not on the basis, or perhaps in the form, that we have tended to presume.

Nichols is somewhat cagey about whether he thinks his positive, prescriptive account amounts to a form of revisionism. Perhaps one reason is that he treats revisionism as a comparatively circumscribed view. (Here is one example: he seems to exclude from the set of revisionist possibilities those theories that hold both that there is an unspecified error and that we successfully refer to responsibility at least sometimes (59-60)). However, I suspect the crux of his reluctance to acknowledge his revisionist commitments is that he thinks standard revisionist and eliminativist accounts (at least about free will, although perhaps more generally) share a mistaken presumption about the reference of key terms.

One of the most arresting features of Nichols' account is his "discretionary" approach to the reference conventions involved in ascriptions of free will and moral responsibility. That is, Nichols maintains that there are multiple legitimate reference conventions for the term 'free will' (and, it seems, 'moral responsibility'). Under one reference convention, it is literally true that we do not have free will, whereas on others, it is literally true that we do have free will (62-7, 157, 164-5). This ambiguity about reference seems to be something that sets apart his account from contemporary revisionist and eliminativist accounts (62, 165-6), and Nichols advertises this as allowing him to agree with both eliminativists and revisionist compatibilists.

To be sure, his discretionism about reference is a provocative and important innovation. However, even granting the discretionary picture of reference, its upshot seems relatively contained and mostly orthogonal to the dialectic between those who claim we should reject moral responsibility and those who think it can be preserved in some modified form. The reason is that Nichols' discretionary (in)compatibilism amounts to a view about the way we think and talk but not so much a view about what we do and feel.

Some context is useful. The last two chapters of Nichols' book are sustained defenses of moral anger and retributivism in our emotional lives and moral practices. So far as Nichols is concerned, the practices and attitudes characteristic of moral responsibility are in good stead, unaffected by the absence of free will and moral responsibility (even of the sort picked out by the incompatibilist-favoring reference conventions for these terms). That is, although the threads of incompatibilist commitments in ordinary thought should be excised, this can be done without much damage to ordinary practices. (Recall: our indeterminist intuitions are insulated from much of our ordinary practices and thoughts.) Thus, on Nichols' account, the practices and attitudes characteristic of moral responsibility are, as a whole, both pragmatically and morally warranted.

Given the foregoing, the sense in which Nichols' discretionism allows him to speak as an eliminativist is only just that -- grounds to speak like an eliminativist, all the while living as a (revisionist) compatibilist. That is, the eliminativism his discretionism allows for is only of the most eviscerated variety. Given Nichols' positive view, our responsibility practices and attitudes are not at stake when we say that free will and moral responsibility do not exist. All discretionism buys is the possibility of acknowledging that we do not have the form of agency demanded by various forms of libertarianism. Nichols hastens to add that it can be psychologically salubrious and a useful curb to overly punitive social practices to remind ourselves that we do not have indeterministic agency (166). However, this is something that compatibilists -- revisionist or not -- can already say.

Nichols' discretionism, though, has even less bite than these remarks suggest. Recall that his argument against libertarianism is a debunking one, turning on the thought that our indeterminist intuitions arise from overconfidence in our powers of introspection. Nichols moves from this to holding that for the sake of exploring alternatives, he is simply assuming that we do not have the forms of agency identified by libertarians (55). I noted above that this is a reasonable enough way to set one's own research agenda. However, it comes at a cost to the robustness of his eliminativist credentials.

Recall that nothing in the argument Nichols advances rules out the possibility that we might actually have indeterministic agency of the sort libertarians defend. Consequently, it seems hasty to insist that the Nichols-style revisionist can also say flatly that we lack free will. All he is licensed to say is something milder, i.e., that our indeterminist intuitions are not well-founded. But that is a long way from showing that we are not agents of the sort required by libertarian accounts. So, in the end, Nichols' discretionism seems to amount to the view that we ought to live like revisionist compatibilists but that we can talk like uncertain eliminativists -- at least when it is useful to do so.

The doubts expressed here are, in many ways, at the periphery of Nichols' highly readable account. What is manifestly true is that this book is worth the careful attention of anyone interested in moral psychology, moral responsibility, or the methodological issues that constrain philosophical debates. At the heart of Nichols' theory is a picture of moral responsibility as a deeply human practice, one that plays an important moral and practical role in our lives. On his account, the intuitions that give rise to libertarian accounts about free will are central to how we think about our agency. At the same time, those intuitions are severable and unnecessary to most of how we live. Blame, retribution, and our moral lives can continue mostly as they were. On these central issues, Nichols seems to me to be exactly right. Responsibility survives, even if, inevitably, it will be doubted another day.