Bounded Thinking: Intellectual virtues for limited agents

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Adam Morton, Bounded Thinking: Intellectual virtues for limited agents, Oxford University Press, 2013, 192pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199658534.

Reviewed by Gilbert Harman, Princeton University


Adam Morton's excellent book is concerned with intellectual virtues for limited agents. That is, it is concerned with what sorts of virtues of this sort there are and how to encourage these virtues in ourselves and others. The relevant virtues especially include virtues of particular thoughts, decisions, or actions, rather than corresponding character traits. And he is especially interested in ways to manage our limitations. He compares the theory of such particular virtues with the theory of knowledge, in that whether a particular act is an instance of a relevant virtue can depend on "external" factors, just as whether one knows something can depend on what the world is like. He is concerned with how difficult it can be to know how difficult it can be to achieve something. He describes various "dilemmas" that arise and what steps might be taken in response. His discussion is often quite original, and there are insights on every page. In what follows, I can only summarize some of Morton's discussion.

To begin with, consider the idea that people can use logic and decision theory in deciding what to think or do. People might decide what to believe and do by starting with their current beliefs and probability and utility assignments and following the principles of some logic or utility theory in order to derive relevant conclusions about what to believe and do. For example, they might attempt to come up with a list of possible actions, calculate the expected utilities of the results of doing one or another item on the list and then decide whether to stop with that list, choosing the best of their current conclusions or to enlarge the list of possible actions in order to consider their expected utilities and perhaps repeat this process again. However, there will be limits to how much time can be spent on these tasks. In many cases there may not be enough time to do any of this.

The main topic of the book is limitation management, how to deal with our limitations: limitations in what we can know and what we can accomplish. People are finite agents. They need a way to manage their limitations. But limitation management cannot normally be accomplished merely by adding further calculations to the initial task. Furthermore, people often need to make quick decisions, for which there may not be enough time to consider more possibilities. At some point decisions will have to be based on quick judgment rather than calculation. Some decisions of this sort may be good, others not. Hopefully, we can encourage one other to make better rather than worse decisions by praising decisions that have good results and complaining about decisions that have bad results.

A further complication is that logic and decision theory are not directly theories of inference or decision. They are in the first instance theories about implication and inconsistency. Furthermore, the beliefs and utility assignments a person actually accepts may often, or even always, contain inconsistencies.

Reasoning from certain beliefs and assignments can sometimes appear to lead to contradiction. Should one conclude in such cases that those particular beliefs and assignments are inconsistent and then try to decide which to give up? Should one try to discover what's wrong with the reasoning that seems to show that they are inconsistent? What if there is no time to think this through?  A person simply has to make a decision about how to proceed. Such a decision may be good and in that case we may praise her for making it and encourage her to do well in the future. Or it may be bad and in that case we may blame her for making the wrong decision. This is one way in which we can try to encourage others to think well.

The book makes significant use of an analogy between theory and practice, between knowledge as an accomplishment and practical accomplishment. Recent discussions in philosophical epistemology that appeal to notions like tracking the truth, reliability, sensitivity, and safety suggest similar ideas about how to think of the theory of practical decision and action. Morton is "suspicious of the vocabulary of inference, premises, and conclusions, as a way of describing real processes of thought, especially action-directed thought." He proposes to evaluate thoughts and beliefs in terms of their leading to success. "The idea is that by attending to the explanatory function of both knowledge and accomplishment, and by dealing with them simultaneously, we may get more purchase on both."

Furthermore, he suggests that we try to understand rationality in terms of knowledge. "Rational belief-acquisition processes are those that generally result in knowledge and rational actions result from processes that generally succeed, and thus result in accomplishments." Of course, a person does not normally consider what is the best thing to believe, period, but rather what is a good answer to a particular question.

One has limited resources. One can only put so much effort into trying to answer a question. Morton suggests that deciding when one has thought enough about a question is like deciding when one should accept an offer for one's house. In either case, one might set a threshold and stop shortly after the threshold has been met.

Morton argues that we should consider the role that intellectual virtues play in limitation management. Such virtues must be learnable, desirable, and "sensitive to the environment and one's capacities to manage information derived from it." The relevant virtues are often virtues of the moment, what it is good to do now. One may exhibit such a virtue at one time but not a moment earlier or later. The relevant virtues are "more like knowledge than like character." They are "features of the way capacities are mobilized in particular circumstances in the service of particular aims" (or are those capacities). "They include virtues of heeding or ignoring other people's comments and virtues of using a normative theory on occasions when in fact it will help someone's thinking (saying 'but there's a contradiction here'), but not when it distracts or misleads)" and capacities to decide when P 's implying Q supports Q rather than discrediting P.

Virtues may be quite specific. A given specific virtue may apply only in a very narrow type of situation. It may or may not be possible to generalize to other situations, to transfer a virtue from one domain to another. Sometimes ignoring new evidence is a virtue (because it would be distracting to consider additional evidence at this time) and sometimes ignoring new evidence is not a virtue. It depends on the context of investigation.

Intellectual virtues are used in evaluating thought. "We encourage and discourage other people's thinking . . . most activity is cooperative . . . We nudge and bully one another into doing things in ways that produce coordinated results . . . To be used in evaluation a virtue needs a name, and a reputation as helpful or unhelpful in a given kind of project." It is useful to have an appropriate name for various intellectual virtues.

As already mentioned, there are "paradoxical epistemic virtues" of ignoring evidence, tolerating contradiction, not following arguments as far as one might, etc. Sometimes it is reasonable to think that this is not the moment for truthfulness.

Relevant virtues are sensitive to situations, resources, and results. There is "no substitute for a vocabulary of virtues when we are evaluating, encouraging, or improving one another's thinking." (These are skills, so virtues include skills.)

Furthermore, Morton argues that it is unlikely that virtues are simple psychological kinds, in contrast with emotions.

Morton points out that that one can wrongly think one knows and one can know without knowing one knows. So, "compounded margins of error are greater than simple ones." Moreover it can be easier to check a solution to a problem than to find a solution in the first place. He discusses the relevance of considerations of computational complexity for the worst case and the average case. On the other hand, human beings are susceptible to error in ways computers are not. "Many accounts of human limitations take account only of complexity, not of bungling, let alone the mysterious interaction between the two." He discusses troubles people appear to have in thinking about conditions and conditional probability. And notes that "we have only a sketchy and misleading commonsense psychology of the scarce resources that we are trying to conserve."

Among decision making virtues are the "capacity to accept that a nice outcome is not going to come, and make the best out of what is really available [and the] capacity to anticipate bad choices and prevent oneself from making them."

"A theory of when advice is likely to be good -- good advice about good advice -- needs the details of actual human psychology." This is an empirical issue, not resolved by concentrating on logic and probability theory. And self-knowledge and self-control are needed for "planning and sequences of tasks."

"We have to plunge into projects without knowing how they will turn out. And we have to hesitate when things are not going according to plan." And sometimes there is a virtue of stubborn ignorance.

Morton discusses Pascalian dilemmas, situations in which one has a practical reason to get oneself to believe something one thinks is clearly false. He goes on to discuss being sure that something one believes is false (Preface Paradox) and believing of a particular ticket in a lottery that it is not the winning ticket. These are among the cases in which it is rational not to believe a consequence of what you believe.

There are partitioning virtues, keeping projects separate, going along with someone else's idea for the present, putting some beliefs in quarantine. One may know that time flows and that it does not flow.

Morton notes that rationality and intelligence are crude concepts. He distinguishes confusion about a plan from perversion, an intellectual vice. (Other vices include sloppiness and wishfulness.) He discusses the psychology of intelligence, the variety of ways to be intelligent, and questions whether there is a general capacity. Instead of thinking of rational procedures, even relative to an agent's perspective, we should think of skills of accomplishment and intellectual virtues that include many ways of being reasonable.

The book ends with an "image of a well-adjusted agent, as a person who is actively, vigilantly, sensitive to [a] triangle of environment, cognition, and result." It "helps to know what the virtues are, to have names and categories for them. . . . An intellectual culture that was centred on norms of encouraged limitation-management would be very different from ours. It would be worth aiming at."