Brain Imaging: What it Can (and Cannot) Tell us About Consciousness

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Robert G. Shulman, Brain Imaging: What it Can (and Cannot) Tell us About Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2013, 180pp., $59.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780199838721.

Reviewed by Colin Klein, Australian National University/University of Illinois at Chicago


Brains are expensive to run. Your brain is 2% of your weight, yet your body spends about 20% of its energy on it. That's because every part of the brain is always firing away, regardless of what you're doing. Some parts do work a little harder now and then, but the regional increases in brain activity due to focused mental activity are quite small -- mere ripples on a great intrinsic tide. Functional brain imaging reports only those tiny fluctuations, though. You might think it has been leaving out something important.

Robert G. Shulman certainly thinks so. Few have thought about brain metabolism as much as Shulman. He's a respected scientist whose NMR studies of metabolism led him naturally to neuroimaging. He performed groundbreaking work on brain metabolism and its correlates, helping to lay the foundation for PET and fMRI. In Brain Imaging, Shulman looks back at a long career and synthesizes that work with his personal reflections on philosophy of science.

Much of Shulman's distinctive contribution to the field, and the strongest chapters, come late in the book. Most neuroimaging experiments look for increases in activation in response to a cognitive task. So they tacitly assume, Shulman argues,that "the brain was active only in response to a sensory or cognitive input, and remained inactive in the absence of the need to process information" (p94). This is really a dubious assumption, and one that's impossible to maintain. Many experiments show activity decreases relative to rest during tasks (p112ff). That's strange: rest was usually included as a putatively inactive baseline. Decreases show that rest was active after all. The standard interpretation of decreases these days is that rest is dominated by activity in particular brain regions. This activity supports self-reflection and social reasoning (Schilbach et al. 2008). That needs to be inhibited during task performance. That's why you see decreases.

Shulman's work on brain metabolism calls this standard story into question. Shulman shows that every area of the brain is active at rest, not just the regions that show task-related decreases. This activity is largely driven by neural firing and neurotransmitter recycling (p105ff). That shows that what's going on isn't mere biological 'housekeeping' (p106). Shulman's findings thus suggest that the whole brain does something cognitively relevant even at rest. Decreases are evidence of regional inhibition during tasks, not special regional activation during rest.

Shulman claims -- and I agree -- that this fact ought to drive functional interpretation more than it has. By analogy, suppose that we wanted to investigate the function of the heart, but we had only facts about changes in heart rate. We might catch the relationship between increased heart rate and arousal. But we would miss the fact that the heart is always beating, and that the beating itself, at whatever rate, plays a vital functional role. So too with brains. The fact that all regions are always doing something ought to make you wonder what that something is, not just what variations in it might mean.

Shulman's metabolic argument itself is technical, and even philosophers familiar with neuroimaging are likely to find it slow going. Crucial concepts like the cerebral metabolic rates of oxygen and glucose are introduced in situ without further explanation (p77) If you're keen on diving in, you might gird yourself by reading Raichle and Mintun's review of brain metabolism (2006) -- also technical, but it will hold your hand a bit more.

So intrinsic activity is probably important. What does it do? Here Shulman gives a two-part answer. Total intrinsic energy usage supports the state of consciousness (p119). Local fluctuations on top are correlated with 'acts' of consciousness (p134). (You'd likely call the latter phenomenal character or content, though Shulman wouldn't like that terminology.) Evidence for the first thesis comes from the correlation between the ability to make reports and total brain energy (Ch 7), while correlations between particular reports and localized fluctuations support the second thesis (Ch 8). This is all phrased in terms of correlations and reportability because of Shulman's behaviorism. I'll say more about that shortly. For now, note that Shulman doesn't really engage with contemporary philosophical work on consciousness. Thomas Nagel is mentioned in passing during a discussion of dualism (p48), and the term 'qualia' occurs once as an unexplained pejorative (p135). The focus is primarily on scientists who work on consciousness (like Christof Koch, p134ff), not contemporary philosophers.

The discussion of local activation in Chapter 8 reviews some of the work on binocular rivalry and on the fusiform face area. If you work on consciousness, most of it will be old hat. The more interesting, less widely-known work is the link between total brain energy and states of consciousness. There is undoubtedly a correlation: the deeper the anesthetic state, for example, the lower the global brain metabolism (p124). Furthermore, this is a manipulable relationship: anesthetics globally reduce firing rates, which in turn drastically reduces energy usage.

So the link seems plausible. Still, I worry. First, Shulman's behaviorism keeps him from asking why or how global energy matters. That's surely an interesting question. Everyone, including Shulman, knows that high global energy is not sufficient for consciousness: epileptic seizures burn a lot of energy in phenomenal darkness. Shulman claims that he's only looking for a necessary condition (p130). Even this is problematic, though, as some viable theories of conscious states treat global energy as a mere epiphenomenon of the real necessary condition. High global energy might be a side-effect of widespread information integration, for example (Tononi 2004). Or the neocortex alone might support consciousness, with anesthetics dragging subcortical structures down through thalamo-cortical links (Alkire et al. 2008). Shulman is aware of these alternatives, but dismisses them with little discussion (p125).

Second, Shulman's focus on consciousness arguably sells intrinsic activity short. Functional imaging (for better or worse) is concerned with regions that differentiate tasks. If the high baseline just correlates with general awareness, then most imaging experiments factor that out by design (just as studies of reading as such must factor out activity in the visual cortex). Linking intrinsic activity to the state of consciousness obscures the fact that intrinsic activity might play some specific role that varies from region to region.

There is a lot of interesting stuff in these chapters, but Shulman is frustratingly brief precisely when you'd like to hear more. Part of the problem is that Shulman really just doesn't like cognitive neuroscience. The reason why -- I'm reading between the lines -- is that cognitive neuroscientists want to test hypotheses about things like working memory, but when you get down to it nobody's got a great idea about what working memory is or how you could be sure that you've actually tested a hypothesis about it. Biochemists these days don't have to worry about puzzles like that. Shulman tried his hand at cognitive neuroscience, and got frustrated with the fuzziness of psychological terms (p15). He concluded that reasonable scientists should stick to studying behavior and the biochemical processes that support it.

I say "reading between the lines," because Shulman's particular beef with cognitive neuroscience isn't clear. The first four chapters are an exercise in philosophy of science, meant to explain why cognitive neuroscience falls short. These will be of less interest to the professional philosopher. Throughout, Shulman claims an adherence to philosophical pragmatism, of the sort endorsed by James, Rorty, and Wittgenstein (p50ff). Pragmatism, claims Shulman, demands that we recognize the deep contingency of scientific concepts. So some concepts (like those in biochemistry) are acceptable because they are very useful, while concepts in cognitive neuroscience aren't useful and so should be abandoned (p53).

What that means in practice is a bit murky -- sometimes we are told that scientists ought to stick to observables (like behavior, or biochemical mechanisms, p12). Sometimes psychological terms are mere "hypotheses created by theories," unresponsive to evidence (p19); other times, psychologists are too willing to alter their hypotheses in the face of new evidence (p90). Sometimes the problem is that cognitive neuroscience relies too heavily on the "everyday" assumptions of folk psychology (p18). Often, following Bennett and Hacker, it's that psychological terms are properly person-level, and so can't be located at the subpersonal level (p55).

The reliance on Bennett and Hacker (2003) is unfortunate, as it keeps Shulman from engaging with the consensus view in cognitive neuroscience (a brief discussion of Craver in chapter 4 aside). Most cognitive neuroscientists, I take it, accept that there are person-level psychological processes. They also believe that the sub-personal processes that they describe are mechanisms on an epistemological par with the unobservables in any other scientific field. They investigate the causal structure of these mechanisms precisely to explain the effects that the mechanisms jointly cause. So cognitive neuroscience does exactly what molecular biology does, just with different stuff.

Now, you might doubt all of this -- but you'd need to tell a story about what makes minds so special. Shulman never quite puts his finger on that. He does have a lot of useful things to say about more specific issues, though. In chapter five, Shulman critiques standard subtractive neuroimaging experiments, giving his insider's perspective on the strengths and weaknesses of brain imaging.

Shulman has two major complaints about neuroimaging. First, many experiments are designed without a clear sense of what would count as evidence against a cognitive hypothesis. That gives neuroimagers a suspicious amount of leeway when they interpret their results. He gives an especially nice example of the flexibility of regional boundaries, showing that the very same set of evidence has been read both for and against the identification of 'willed action' and attention (pp87-8). I think all of this is quite right (Mole and Klein 2010), and an endlessly frustrating aspect of neuroimaging.

Second, he argues that cognitive neuroscience must localize cognitive processes in the brain. That's a dubious strategy. Neuroimaging shows that most brain regions are differentially active across a variety of different domains. So there is no simple one-one mapping between brain states and cognitive states (p84ff). This is a deep problem, one that especially complicates so-called 'reverse inference' studies intended to test cognitive theories (Poldrack 2006).

I feel that Shulman overplays his hand a bit here. Functional imaging does not require every cognitive process to be localized. Reading a novel is clearly not localizable, because it depends on a bunch of distinct cognitive processes working together. Neuroimaging is useful so long as cognitive processes map one-one to brain regions at some level of decomposition.

Now, you might doubt whether we can find even that level of mapping. (I do.) That is a long argument, though, and one that depends on detailed considerations on the structure of so-called cognitive ontologies. Shulman's behaviorist leanings keep him from adding to this discussion. Instead, he's stuck comparing fMRI to phrenology. That analogy is getting tired, and in any case Shulman inadvertently undermines his own point. He claims that the early phrenologists proposed a bump for 'republicanism,' an echo of current neuroimaging excesses (p93). That's not quite right, though. Fowler and Fowler proposed a bump for self-esteem, which they claim is important for many things -- including, but not limited to, claiming your republican birthright against oligarchs and monarchs (Fowler and Fowler 1849, p117-8). That is hardly less silly, true. But it shows that even cognitive neuroscience's disreputable forbears were sensitive to these ontological complexities.

As I said, though, the later chapters are the strongest. The epilogue is especially lively and charming. It describes Shulman's intellectual journey from a precocious student of Lionel Trilling to a careful scientist of in vivo metabolism. I'd actually recommend starting with it -- once you see where Shulman is coming from, the thrust of the early chapters becomes much clearer. Shulman has read a fair bit of philosophy, has thought seriously about it, and (happiest to my ear) realizes that philosophy of science is relevant to scientists.

That said, Shulman is still a scientist at heart. Despite the title there is relatively little here for philosophers of mind. Philosophers of neuroscience will find more of interest. If you care about brains, or about how we should learn about them, Shulman raises a host of fascinating issues.


Alkire, Michael T, Anthony Hudetz, and Giulio Tononi, (2008). Consciousness and anesthesia. Science, 322(5903):876-880.

Bennett, Max R. and Peter M. Hacker (2003). Philosophical foundations of neuroscience. Blackwell Publishing, Oxford.

Fowler, Orson S. and Lorenzo N. Fowler (1849). Fowler's Practical Phrenology. Fowler and Wells, New York.

Mole, Chris and Colin Klein (2010). Confirmation, refutation and the evidence of fMRI. In Foundational Issues In Human Brain Mapping, ed S. Hanson and M. Bunzl. MIT Press, Cambridge.

Poldrack, Russell A. (2006). Can cognitive processes be inferred from neuroimaging data? Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 10(2):59-63.

Raichle, Marcus E. and Mark A. Mintun (2006). Brain work and brain imaging. Annual Review of Neuroscience, 29:449-476.

Schilbach, Leo et al. (2008). Minds at rest? Social cognition as the default mode of cognizing and its putative relationship to the "default system" of the brain. Consciousness and cognition, 17:457-467.

Tononi, Giulio. (2004). An information integration theory of consciousness. BMC neuroscience, 5(1):1-22.