Brains, Buddhas, and Believing: The Problem of Intentionality in Classical Buddhist and Cognitive-Scientific Philosophy of Mind

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Dan Arnold, Brains, Buddhas, and Believing: The Problem of Intentionality in Classical Buddhist and Cognitive-Scientific Philosophy of Mind, Columbia University Press, 2012, 328pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231145466.

Reviewed by Charles Goodman, Binghamton University


Dan Arnold is one of our leading scholars of Indian thought, but his latest book is more than just a scholarly exposition of Indian debates about the nature of mind. Brains, Buddhas, and Believing is an important work of philosophy that offers arguments aimed simultaneously at classical Buddhist thinkers and at important contemporary physicalists. Numerous books have offered accounts of Buddhist tenets, but few have ventured sophisticated and serious critiques of those tenets. Arnold's book now joins Griffiths' On Being Mindless among the key works that those who wish to defend Buddhist philosophy today must read to understand the scope of the challenges they face.

Chapter 1 lays out some major structural aspects of Dharmakīrti's view through an examination of his famous argument for rebirth. This discussion embodies the careful scholarship and broad knowledge on display throughout the book. Arnold handles a number of difficult issues well; an example is the helpful and very clear discussion of mental consciousness, or manovijñāna, on p. 34. Although the discussion mostly seems pitched to those already familiar with Buddhist thought, philosophers of mind not trained in Indian traditions could learn a great deal about Dharmakīrti by reading it.

Chapter 2 offers a brief, well-informed, critical discussion of the views of Fodor and Dennett. Arnold presents familiar material from a distinctive perspective, allowing him to relate it in illuminating ways to Indian ideas.

In many ways the heart of the book, Chapter 3 contains a Kantian-inspired challenge to both Buddhist and physicalist accounts of mental processes. According to Arnold, these views are not in a position to explain how information from the senses manages to lead to fully-formed conceptual judgments. As a result, they cannot account for the contentfulness of these judgments. In several passages, he suggests that we might deal with this issue by postulating a Kantian faculty of spontaneity, which is responsible for the synthesis of perceptual information into judgments expressible by that-clauses. The operation of this faculty is in some sense non-causal, though Arnold is not completely clear about what that sense is. In other passages, he seems to back away from asserting such a faculty, and to restrict himself to the weaker claim that meaning and thought involve an aspect of normativity that cannot be characterized exclusively in causal terms.

Chapter 4 focuses on Dharmakīrti's semantic theory, known as apoha or "exclusion." Arnold presses the standard problem of how to connect perception, which for Dharmakīrti is entirely nonconceptual, with a structured judgment that could form part of an inference. But he also criticizes Dharmakīrti from an unexpected and highly original direction. He asks how Dharmakīrti could account for the process by which a child learns its first language. This issue was not central to ancient Indian discussions of language, and perhaps as a result, Dharmakīrti did not develop an adequate theoretical response to the problem. Arnold effectively shows this much, and thereby highlights Dharmakīrti's failure to give sufficient consideration to social aspects of language and cognition; but the degree to which this line of argument supports Arnold's own Kantian theses is open to question.

Chapter 5 focuses on the key concept of svasaṃvitti, often translated as "reflexive awareness." This chapter contains a careful and sophisticated exploration of some difficult lines from Dignāga. It also contains a fair-minded and lucid presentation of Dharmakīrti's most important argument for his views on this topic, the "constraint of joint apprehension" argument (Skt. sahopalambha-niyama.) The chapter concludes with a detailed discussion of a line of argument, presented by the Śaiva philosopher Rāmakaṇṭha, originally intended to establish the existence of a real self. Arnold holds, though, that the argument does not succeed in establishing its intended conclusion. It was unclear to me what of importance he thinks Rāmakaṇṭha did succeed in showing through this reasoning.

Chapter 6 begins with consideration of an argument, developed in the Mīmāṃsaka tradition, and intended to show the eternal preexistence of language. As in previous work, Arnold draws on quite a wide range of Indian texts and philosophers to make his case. Here again, he creatively appropriates this argument to his own, rather different purposes: supporting the ineliminability and irreducibility of an intentional level of description. As presented by the fourth-century CE philosopher Śabara, the argument is that the use of language can never have begun, because the act of introducing a linguistic convention itself requires the use of language. As Arnold puts it, the act of creating a relation between a linguistic item or symbol and some entity or entities in the world "does not stand to reason unless we presuppose that both the agent and the audience of this act already have (what we were here trying to understand) the idea of meaning something" (204).

Arnold is well aware that his physicalist opponents hold that language arose through an evolutionary process, and he agrees with this claim sufficiently to reject the radical intended conclusion of the historical argument he appropriates. But "Mīmāṃsakas would argue that it's just as unclear how persons in the remote past could at any particular point first have 'conferred meaning' on the world as it is hard to imagine in the present what it could look like to do that now; the appeal to an evolutionary timescale does not eliminate the difficulty" (211). Arnold suggests, as a result, that it is "impossible to imagine the first devising, by hitherto nonlinguistic beings, of linguistic conventions" (212).

Arnold is on shaky ground here, however; I think I can easily imagine what he says he cannot. Suppose we are given some creatures like prairie dogs that have the ability, widely shared among infralinguistic animals, to learn by association: for example, that the howl of the coyote is often followed by the arrival of a dangerous predator. Now suppose that a particular prairie dog, perhaps due to a mutation, begins to emit a distinctive cry of fear whenever it sees a coyote. The other prairie dogs could easily come to learn that a cry that sounds like that indicates an imminent coyote, and thereby gain a significant survival advantage. This family of prairie dogs could propagate across the plains, and soon all the prairie dogs could be emitting a cry of this kind. Indeed, the same process could produce a population with dozens of simple signs like this one. Such animals would have the capacity to utter meaningful sounds without having the concept of "meaning."

Now, let's endow these creatures with the very capacity Arnold thinks is insufficient to solve the problem: the capacity, theorized by Dignāga and Dharmakīrti, for apoha or "exclusion." That is, let's give these primitive quasi-linguistic beings the ability to form new concepts: more general ones, that include several already existing categories, and more specific ones, that exclude all those entities within an existing category not satisfying a certain condition. I think it would be relatively simple for the resulting beings to create, first the general category "sound," and then the metalinguistic terms "word" and finally "meaning." One of these creatures could teach a new, abstract term to others by giving them examples, and thus leading them internally to perform the operation of exclusion for themselves.

There are numerous holes in this account.; I haven't given any story about the origin of grammar, for example. But if this is even the skeleton of a plausible account of the origin of a simple language, then Arnold's Mīmāṃsaka-inspired argument clearly fails. The moral would be: don't bet against the power of gradual, stepwise evolutionary accounts to explain complex behaviors.

The rest of Chapter 6 looks at Madhyamaka, and specifically at Candrakīrti's criticisms of Dignāga. Here Arnold uses impressive, textually based arguments to suggest that Candrakīrti would endorse the view that the intentional level of description is ineliminable. Arnold's take on Madhyamaka plays a notable role in his overall project: it allows him to claim that he is not criticizing the Buddhist tradition as a whole, but only part of it, and that some Buddhists could and would endorse his arguments. But this claim rests on a highly controversial interpretation that assimilates the Madhyamaka view about the status of persons to that of the Pudgalavādins. Though such a reading is not unprecedented, it faces grave difficulties. The Pudgalavādins were widely criticized for misunderstanding the Buddha's teaching of non-self, including by figures we recognize as Mādhyamikas, such as Śāntarakṣita.

According to Arnold, "to argue (with Kant) that 'there is pure practical reason' is also effectively to argue that an exhaustively impersonal account of the mental is finally unintelligible" (113). One of the greatest intellectual achievements of the Buddhist tradition was the discovery of the idea that thought and agency are made possible by, and actually consist in, a complex array of impersonal processes. Versions of this idea appear frequently in the Perfection of Wisdom sūtras. Indeed, this is exactly what is meant by "dependent arising" in such texts as the Śālistambha Sūtra. The prominent role of quotations from the Śālistambha in Śāntideva's Śikṣā-samuccaya is evidence that Mādhyamikas did not reject this discovery, but built their view upon it. Arnold, on the other hand, does wish to deny this insight -- in spite of the fact that the advent of scientific psychology has given it far more empirical support than it ever could have had in ancient India.

Like many other Kantian-inspired accounts, the one Arnold offers as an alternative to cognitivism is initially quite compelling, but when carefully and closely examined, bafflingly obscure. One rather basic question unanswered in Arnold's presentation is: could there be a being that was physically a duplicate of a normal human, but was lacking in spontaneity? And if so, what would such a being be like?

This question represents a dilemma for Arnold. Perhaps there could be such a being and she would be radically crippled, perhaps by being unable to speak or understand the world. But since there is no physical difference between her and a functioning human, we cannot avoid the conclusion that there must be spooky mind-stuff constantly causally intervening in the world, and that the laws of physics must be false. More likely, Arnold would say that there couldn't be such a being: anything physically like a human could be brought under an intentional description, although we might miss the intentional aspects of that being's existence by failing to bring such a description to bear. But on this horn of the dilemma, intentional phenomena will supervene on the physical, so that Arnold will fall within the broadly physicalist camp after all. Indeed, on this reading, Arnold's view looks rather like Dennett's "intentional stance" account, which the book rejects (75-80).

Arnold's suggestion that our ability to get judgments out of perception depends on a mysterious Kantian faculty of spontaneity seems implausible in light of quite basic discoveries from psychology. Patients with face-blindness induced by head injuries are deficient precisely in the ability to transition from perceptual information to the recognition that "This person is Mary." Yet surely their metaphysical capacity for spontaneity, if they ever had one, is intact. What they have lost is the physical basis for an entirely causal, subconscious form of information processing.

Meanwhile, Kant's connection between conceptual thought and freedom contrasts starkly with one of the central claims of many Asian traditions: that the process of imposing conceptual filters on our experience is a principal source of bondage and limitation. Both Buddhists and Daoists frequently emphasize that the categories with which we understand our experience can drastically restrict the range of possibilities we can see. Artistic and technological creativity may often emerge from overcoming the limitations imposed on us by the subconscious processes that, usually without our noticing it, impose categories on our experience.

Arnold places much weight on a particular transcendental argument. He claims that "reason's being practical is not, in fact, something that can coherently be denied, insofar as it is only in terms of reasoning that such a denial is even intelligible" (200). This would be a good argument against true eliminativists such as the Churchlands, but it fails against opponents who hold, not that there is no such thing as reasoning, but that theoretical reasoning consists in a causally describable process. It's perfectly consistent to claim that my mental representations have been causally determined to arrive at the accurate conclusion that there is no Kantian spontaneity, and that human brains do not respond to reasons as such but only to reasons embodied in syntactically coded representations.

Indeed, wanting my beliefs to be accurate is plausibly related to claims about causation that are not easy to square with Arnold's views. I want to believe that the barn is red if and only if it is red. If I am lucky, my senses and my brain have evolved in such a way that the redness of the barn can cause me to believe that the barn is red. We may begin to worry that, here as in the free will debate, Kantian spontaneity will turn out to be nothing but randomness, and so worse than useless in relation to what we legitimately want.

Though, in most of the book, Arnold is quite fair to the Buddhist tradition, there are occasions when he seems not to give a sympathetic account of Buddhist views. He writes, for example, that "it's hard to see how essentially momentary mental particulars could so much as 'conceive' themselves as resembling each other" (197). Put in this plural form, the sentence seems to be making a plausible point; but this phrasing is tendentious. If we have any understanding at all of what a momentary mental particular would be, then we understand how it could represent something about the past: it could have a content like "The barn yesterday was red." But then, what on earth would prevent mental particular A from having the content "Past experience B felt similar to past experience C"? And this kind of cognition is all Dharmakīrti needs to sustain the aspect of his views Arnold is criticizing.

Arnold stresses that historical Buddhist thinkers were not physicalists, and that some of their religious commitments were incompatible with physicalism. Yet his book as a whole indirectly makes a strong case for the compatibility of the main thrust of Buddhist philosophy of mind with an empirically informed naturalism and with a scientific worldview. Recent years have seen the emergence and increasing influence of views that draw inspiration from Buddhist teachings and that recognize the immense value of Buddhist meditative practices, while rejecting magical and mythic elements of the tradition and embracing a naturalist outlook. Philosophical advocates of such views should be eager to engage with the challenges presented in Arnold's original and stimulating book, and the rest of us can learn much by considering the issues it raises.