Branching Space-Times: Theory and Applications

Branching Space Times

Nuel Belnap, Thomas Müller, and Tomasz Placek, Branching Space-Times: Theory and Applications, Oxford University Press, 2022, 441pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190884314.

Reviewed by Valentin Goranko, Stockholm University


This is an impressively deep and rich research monograph, systematically and rigorously presenting the “Branching Space-Times” theory (BST) developed by the authors in a long-lasting research project which started with Nuel Belnap's founding paper (1992). The focal concept here is indeterminism from the perspectives of modern physics and the philosophy of science, and the authors brand their theory “a theory of local indeterminism”.

The book mainly targets philosophers of physics and philosophers of time. It should also be of interest to a broader audience of physicists, mathematicians and, to some extent, even logicians. To understand some essential parts of the book, the reader needs to have good knowledge and understanding of the basics, respectively, of relativity theory, quantum mechanics, causation, and some probability theory. Much of the book (about half) is quite technical and rigorous, often with detailed mathematical proofs. Thus, it presumes a solid mathematical background and technical disposition for beneficial reading.

The book is divided in three main parts: I. THE CORE THEORY, consisting of 7 chapters, II. APPLICATIONS, consisting of 3 chapters, and III. APPENDIX. Each chapter ends with a list of exercises (a somewhat unusual feature for a research monograph, but one that is useful here) which are mostly facts from the chapter content requiring formal proofs, or at least some argumentation. The Appendix contains some deferred detailed proofs, some additional material, and answers to selected exercises. The book ends with an extensive bibliography (about 200 entries), a name index and a subject index.

In what follows, I will outline the content of the book per chapters, some of which will be more sketchy than others, and will discuss some of the key concepts of the theory as well as some specific features of the book.


The book starts with an informal and non-technical introduction in Chapter 1, explaining the philosophical foundations and conceptual basics of the Branching Space-Times (BST) theory. The core idea is to treat indeterminism ‘modally’, via alternative open possibilities for the future. Notably, despite the apparent close similarity with the possible worlds representation of indeterminism, BST opposes that representation, and the authors emphasize that it is not a possible-worlds theory. A key primitive concept here is ‘real possibility’. Unlike in standard possible-worlds frameworks, real possibilities are not alternatives to the future, because (quoting) “the future, being in the future, has not yet happened [and] none of the possibilities for the future is actual yet”, but they are alternatives for (what can happen in) the future. Thus, in BST there is no actual future, hence there is no actual history.

The underlying domain of discourse of BST is called ‘Our World’. It comprises objects, conceived as the possible events that are linked to a given actual event by chains of forward and backward steps along a ‘pre-causal relation’, thus representing the set of all real possibilities accessible from that event. The authors discuss some metaphysical issues pertaining to Our World.

The introduction is altogether clear and useful but—at least for me—some points are prematurely made here, and I only properly understood them further in the course of reading the actual exposition of the theory. So, this is just a gentle warning for the hitherto-uninitiated in the theory reader, to be a little patient.

The authors then systematically lay the foundations of BST in Chapter 2. They first formally introduce ‘Our World’, as a non-empty set of ‘events’ with a strict partial ordering on them, and the key notion of ‘history’, as a maximal, upwards-directed set of events in Our World. The chapter then presents and discusses fivefundamental postulates about Our World, that eventually define the core structure of the BST theory, called ‘common BST structure’. In summary, this is a strict dense partial ordering, where every two histories intersect, every bounded below chain has an infimum, every bounded above chain has a supremum on every history which contains it, and the orders of these suprema on the different histories are synchronised in a certain precise sense. Some basic useful consequences of these postulates and other related observations are proved in detail, or presented as exercises.

The chapter is well-written and generally easy to read, but, apparently, the authors already assume the reader’s familiarity with the concept of ‘Minkowski space-time’ and related notions, though this is not stated explicitly and I do not find such an assumption well-justified. That term is used repeatedly in this chapter but not properly presented until Chapter 9. Other important related concepts that are used but not properly defined in the otherwise very systematically presented text, include: ‘pre-causal relation’ (ok, this is taken as primitive), ‘really possible event’, ‘states’ vs ‘events’, ‘spatio-temporal point’, ‘spatio-temporal structure’, ‘space-like separated events’, ‘cause-like relation’, ‘space-like relation’, ‘spatially maximal instantaneous objects’, etc.

It is not always clear when the authors are using such terms in an intuitive sense, and when they are to be understood precisely. In particular, this applies to all references to ‘space’, ‘space-time’, and ‘spatio-temporal’. For instance, the first such definition, of ‘space-time location’ only appears on p.39. So, again, a piece of advice to the uninitiated reader: be patient, if necessary.[1]

Chapter 3 is the key chapter for understanding the BST theory, so I will discuss it in a bit more detail. It begins with the question: where and how do two histories branch? There are two natural options consistent with the postulates of common BST structures: one, where the histories have a supremum of their common part, called a ‘choice point’, and the other, where that supremum does not (or need not) exist, but the part of each of the histories above their intersection has an infimum. Both options make good technical sense, so the question “with or without choice points”, becomes a purely conceptual one. The two possible uniform answers lead to two alternative versions of the BST theory: the first, originally developed version BST92 (named after Belnap's original 1992 paper from which the book stems) postulates existence of choice points, whereas the second, later developed BSTNF (for “new foundations”) excludes them. In this chapter the authors present systematically, compare, and discuss these two theories, starting with BST92.

The next important concept of BST92 is the concept of ‘elementary possibility’ at an event e, that being an equivalent class of histories with respect to the equivalence relation of ‘undividedness’ at e (guaranteed by an additional postulate for BST92). That is, it is a maximal set of histories passing through e and undivided at e (meaning that every two of them share an event strictly in the future of e). Now, the event e is said to be deterministic if there is only one elementary possibility at e, otherwise it is indeterministic. The chapter discusses some applications to physics, based on a special class of BST structures, called ‘Minkowskian branching structures’, properly defined in Chapter 9.

Following this, BSTNF is presented, where the notions of ‘local point-wise alternatives’ for an event, and then ‘local history-wise alternatives’ naturally emerge. Eventually, BSTNF structures are defined and their technical details studied.

Finally, BST92 and BSTNF are compared in terms of their topological properties, and then in terms of their suitability for the intended applications. The authors show how the two theories and their underlying structures translate to each other, with full details provided in the appendix.

Chapter 4 defines and discusses (basic) transitions and histories in the context of both BST theories, and lays the groundwork for their further applications in Part II. As is the case with events, there are two kinds of basic transitions, deterministic and indeterministic. The chapter then discusses the topological aspects of BST, and the authors show that BST admits a natural topology, called here ‘diamond topology’. It ends with a brief note presenting branching-style semantics for the Ockhamist branching time temporal logic in BST structures, but does not explore this topic further. This is the first of essentially only two places in the book which mention any links of BST to formal (temporal) logic (the other one is in section 10.6). So, the book eventually leaves logicians (like myself) wanting more, or even somewhat disappointed, in that respect. However, one can take that as a challenge for them to explore the formal logical features and applications of BST in future work.

Chapter 5 bears the title “Modal Funny Business” (the funny part of which was not fully clear to me) and deals with ‘modal correlation’ which, by analogy with probabilistic correlation, means that two individually possible outcomes (basic transitions) do not combine to yield a possible joint outcome (transition), i.e., they do not belong to the same history, and hence are not independent.

This topic relates to the ‘paradox’ attributable to Albert Einstein, Boris Podolsky, and Nathan Rosen (1935) implying that the description of physical reality provided by quantum mechanics is incomplete. Two types of ‘funny business’ are discussed: combinatorial and explanatory, where the former generally implies the latter and both are equivalent on BST92 structures. The chapter includes a series of technical results relating these and other variations of modal funny business, in both kinds of strictures, for BST92 and for BSTNF.

Chapter 6 is devoted to causation in BST, regarded as a two-place relation between cause and effect, defined and explained in terms of transitions. Causes in BST are understood as sets of (simple) transitions and a special role is played by ‘indeterministic originating causes (causae causantes)’. The authors argue that “in sharp contrast to other theories of causation, non-trivial causation [in BST] depends on indeterminism." Following J. L. Mackie's (1974) taxonomy of conditions, the authors consider INUS conditions (where INUS stands for  ‘insufficient, but non-redundant part of an unnecessary but sufficient condition’) and show that the causae causantes of BST have precisely the structure of (at least) INUS conditions. The chapter then goes on to further explore causae causantes in BST92 and becomes fairly technical.

Chapter 7 develops a BST-based theory of objective single-case probabilities (propensities). It states two conditions of adequacy for such a theory: i) formal: it should be able to satisfy the axioms of standard probability theory, and ii) philosophical: it should be able to make good sense of propensities, successfully addressing some known objections, such as Paul Humphreys’s (1985) paradox which suggests that propensities cannot be probabilities. The authors construct causal probability spaces in BST and discuss, inter alia, how that theory resolves Humphreys’s paradox.


The first major application of BST presented in the book is to analyze ‘nonlocal quantum correlations’ in Chapter 8, using the known concept of probabilistic correlation and its previously discussed (in Chapter 5) analogue modal correlation. The occurrences of such phenomena were called (in Chapter 5) ‘modal funny business’ (MFB) and (in Chapter 7) ‘probabilistic funny business’ (PFB). The first approach to analysing quantum correlations with BST presented here is based on modal correlations. The difficulty with explaining their occurrence is that (quoting) “If two distant events each have a number of different possible outcomes and these events cannot causally influence one another, then how could some joint outcomes be impossible?” The authors explain modal correlations in BST92 using deterministic hidden variables, which they call ‘instruction sets’. Then, they explore the possibility of explaining probabilistic funny business (PFB) by invoking probabilistic hidden variables. Both tasks are caried out via long and fairly involved technical work and the outcomes are not easy to summarise in the space available here.

The next major application of BST, presented in Chapter 9, is its application to relativity theory. The main issue here is how to combine local indeterminism and relativistic space-times. For that, the authors first introduce a special kind of BST structures, called ‘Minkowskian branching structures’, in which histories are similar to the space-times of relativistic physics (more precisely, isomorphic to Minkowski space-time structures), which are shown to satisfy the axioms of BSTNF structures (which in turn was apparently the main reason for developing the BSTNF theory). Thereafter, the chapter becomes technically rather more demanding,  by first naturally relating BSTNF structures with differential manifolds and their topological generalisations, and then proceeding with BST analysis of general relativity theory. This is the most mathematically involved chapter of the book, but it is for good reasons.

The last application, presented in Chapter 10, is to the philosophy (esp. metaphysics) of time. It is concerned with a BST perspective on presentism, focusing on the problem of how to resolve the widely perceived conflict of presentism with special relativity theory and how to make it more ‘relativity-friendly’. With regards to that, after discussing the problem of defining the present in special relativity theory, the authors distinguish two different views of the present—one static, based on simultaneity and the other dynamic, based on ‘co-presentness’, and argue that “it is the latter role that is important for presentism as a doctrine in the metaphysics of time”. The distinction extends to static vs dynamic treatments of past and future, and also involves some ideas and results from previous chapters. Most of this chapter is relatively non-technical and only assumes background on the basics of BST developed in Chapters 2 and 3.

There is much more of substance in the book than the space-time constraints of this review allow to be discussed.

In summary, this book is a truly impressive tour-de-force demonstration of the authors’ expert skills in analysing challenging philosophical problems and proposing solutions to them using sophisticated technical tools provided by the BST theory presented in the book. Altogether, this is not an easy read at all, but I expect it will be quite a rewarding one for the motivated, diligent, and persistent reader, and definitely worth the substantial amount of time and effort required to properly understand it.


Belnap, N., (1992), “Branching space-time”, Synthese, 92(3):385–434.

Einstein, A., Podolsky, B., and Rosen, N. (1935), “Can quantum-mechanical description of physical reality be considered complete?” Physical Review, 47(10):777–780.

Humphreys, P., (1985), “Why propensities cannot be probabilities”, Philosophical Review, 94:557–570.

Mackie, J. L., (1974), The Cement of the Universe, Oxford University Press.


[1] I would suggest to the authors that they consider providing a concise supplementary text covering the necessary preliminaries and, inter alia, defining and explaining that concept and other basics of relativity theory and quantum mechanics needed for better understanding of the book. These preliminaries could be posted somewhere on the web and later included in the next edition of the book, if there is one. Also, some footnotes in the book say things or make points that are essential for the better understanding of the main content and should rather have been included in the main text.