Placeholder book cover

Ronald Loeffler, Brandom, Polity, 268 pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745664200.

Reviewed by Pietro Salis, University of Cagliari


In recent years, a new phase in the reception and understanding of Robert Brandom's thought has been signaled by the appearance of several monographs, beginning with Jeremy Wanderer's Robert Brandom.[1] The most complete general introduction to Brandom's philosophy, so far, is surely the new book by Ronald Loeffler, which covers a number of issues in Brandom's normative inferentialist philosophy of language, his reading of the thought of Kant and Hegel, his endorsement of pragmatism, and his recent analytic pragmatist understanding of philosophical expressivism.

In the first chapter, "Meaning and Communication", Loeffler defines and presents various mainstream views in contemporary semantics, focusing especially on representationalist and truth-conditional accounts (which he calls "the Received View"), and then presents a taxonomy of Brandom's main criticisms of those views. This approach effectively offers a series of strong arguments that pave the way to Brandom's normative inferentialist semantics. Loeffler's presentation of Brandom's semantics focuses on the ambitions of Brandom's philosophy of language to explain how meaning and communication obtain in the world. Finally, he shows how such an explanation is given in terms of social practices, without presupposing notions like truth, truth conditions, or representation, which are the usual primitives of such explanations.

The second chapter employs an original approach. Before presenting the general axes of Brandom's philosophy of language, Loeffler deals with Brandom's readings of Kant and Hegel, showing how influential and productive their legacies remain. He dedicates special attention to Kant's doctrine of the normative nature of reason: the idea that our judgments are normatively constrained, that they must form a coherent unified set, that we are rational in undertaking a set of special responsibilities for our judgements, and so on. Loeffler reads in these Kantian ideas the main inspiration of Brandom's philosophy, what we may call his methodological preference for normative vocabulary above other philosophically interesting metalanguages.

These ideas lead to a presentation of Kant's connected conception of autonomy, the idea that rational agents act according to their grasp of rules, binding themselves to these rules by autonomously committing to them. Soon after, Loeffler introduces the normative notions of commitments and entitlements, which concern how agents are constrained by norms and are able to recognize how others are committed to or entitled to certain applications of rules. This is an excellent starting point for Loeffler to introduce phenomenalism about norms, the idea that normative statuses like commitments and entitlements depend on the normative attitudes of agents/speakers.

Finally, focusing on Hegel, the discussion extends and develops this conception of normativity with the notion of mutual recognition. With Hegel we gain a perspective on the autonomy of the synthesizing activity of reason that conceives it as creating its own norms, during a process that is temporally extended and involves a wide range of participants: the synthesizing activity of reason is social and historical. Loeffler, at this point, uses this Hegelian perspective to read commitments and entitlements as an interplay of perspectives of mutual recognition in such a social and historical process. This move opens the way -- unexpectedly, in a chapter devoted to Brandom's readings of Kant and Hegel -- to Loeffler's introducing the game of giving and asking for reasons, the very heart of Brandom's theory of discursive practice.

The third chapter goes to the core of Brandom's philosophy by presenting a wide account of "scorekeeping", the way speakers keep the "deontic score", in terms of commitments and entitlements, of themselves and of other speakers. Loeffler provides a detailed presentation of scorekeeping, starting by clearly characterizing how Brandom's project is reductive -- not in the usual naturalistic sense, but in the normative non-naturalistic sense of explaining discursive practices just by means of normative vocabulary. The account begins with an account of autonomous discursive practices that focuses on the centrality of assertive moves. This framework provides the basis for a deeper treatment of commitments and entitlements, which are properly attributed to, and undertaken by, assertive moves. At this point, the terrain is congenial to make relations of material incompatibility between commitments and entitlements explicit. Once these basic raw materials are in place, Loeffler develops a presentation, very detailed and full of examples, of the default-and-challenge structure of discursive entitlement.

The fourth chapter is a presentation of Brandom's semantics. Loeffler starts with the explanatory notion of an inferential role, the well-known idea that meaning depends on a number of inferential transitions. He then presents Sellars' notion of material inference, the idea that the inferences articulating the contents of our claims are those that are good in terms of the nonlogical concepts involved. Loeffler then explains the special features of material inferences: that they are non-monotonic, so that the presence of further premises can alter their goodness; and that they are also counterfactually robust, because every material inference is good under a range of hypothetical circumstances.

At this point, Loeffler presents the substitutional understanding of singular terms and predicates in Brandom's framework and also the anaphoric conception of reference. This chapter is a good introduction to Brandom's semantics, even though it fails to mention the further resources that Brandom later added to the connected problems (for instance, his treatment of the compositionality of meaning based on his development of incompatibility semantics in Between Saying and Doing). Loeffler does, however, go back to semantic themes in later chapters, providing a more detailed overall account.

The fifth chapter offers a global and systematic account of how, in Brandom's view, discursive practices relate to the realm of perception and action, and of how such perspectives determine a particular conception of discursive and practical intentionality. This theme is useful in introducing Brandom's conception of discursive practitioners as "sapient beings" able to monger conceptual contents and to offer contentful responses to other moves in the practice. Loeffler adopts here an interesting way of presenting such a conception. He starts with an account of basic practical intentionality, the way in which merely sentient beings may be intentionally directed towards environing items while engaging in feedback-oriented loops. He then clarifies how such intentionality amounts, generally, to a conception of basic aboutness: sentient creatures use such feedback-governed abilities to map and track items during their interaction with their environment. This ability, furthermore, is entirely describable in terms of perceptual dispositions, those that Brandom calls reliable differential dispositions to respond to environmental stimuli.

At this point, it is easy for Loeffler to introduce Brandom's view of observational knowledge, which is connected to Sellars' criticism of the Myth of the Given. For Brandom, perceptual dispositions, in this context, are not sufficient: such sensory states and episodes must be placed in a network of conceptual resources. This requirement also introduces the discursive type of intentionality (i.e., contentfulness, the intentionality that characterizes sapient beings, the participants in discursive practice). This ability to deal with contentful states, once in place, offers the background to fully grasp observational beliefs and knowledge as based on the ability to make conceptual use of perceptual states and episodes. Loeffler here introduces the main ideas of Brandom's epistemology, in which the epistemological notions of truth, justification, and belief are explained in terms of commitments, entitlements, and incompatibility. Having a belief corresponds to being committed to a certain propositional content; being justified corresponds to being entitled to it; and considering it true corresponds to endorsing it. Finally, the chapter explores how such an account of the connection between perception and concepts understands the possibility of conceptual contents being empirical. Having put these ideas in place, Loeffler introduces Brandom's conception of intentional agency and, in particular, his notion of practical commitment.

The sixth chapter is entirely dedicated to a central theme in Brandom's philosophy, namely the special role of logical vocabulary, offering the raw materials to introduce the expressivist conception of reason. In the expressivist reading, logical operators permit us to make conceptual contents and relations explicit. The chapter presents logical vocabulary in the way Brandom characterized it in Between Saying and Doing as an "LX vocabulary", a special metalanguage that is fundamental in specifying certain features of what we do in using an object language. Here, Loeffler's introduction to such metalanguages is particularly rich, especially thanks to his reconstruction of their Kantian genesis; Loeffler uses, in fact, the reconstructions provided by Brandom in his recent book on Sellars.[2] The Kantian reading establishes a fundamental connection between LX vocabularies and Kant's account of categories, "the pure concepts of understanding".

Loeffler then offers a useful synthesis of Brandom's account of the basic abilities needed to participate in the practices that can be specified and improved using these expressively powerful vocabularies. Furthermore, the chapter offers a good introduction to the expressive importance of the stronger logical operators: conditionals and negation. Conditional expressions are fundamental for making inferences explicit, permitting an explicit evaluation of their goodness and, eventually, their endorsement. Negation highlights the situation where two or more commitments are mutually incompatible. Such elements of logical vocabulary, therefore, are crucial for every practice based on the centrality of asserting and inferring, because their use improves our ability to evaluate the goodness of such moves.

At this point, Loeffler introduces the semantics for logical vocabulary, specifying how it conforms to Brandom's inferentialist commitment to eschewing truth and truth conditions as explanatory notions. The chapter ends with an account of another interesting and powerful vocabulary that Brandom presented in Between Saying and Doing: the modal vocabulary and, in general, the unified treatment of analytic, metaphysical, and nomological modalities.[3]

Chapter Seven introduces Brandom's views on representation. Loeffler strongly emphasizes Brandom's explanatory anti-representationalism, the view that representation does not play an explanatory role in an account of conceptual content, and how this notion is replaced, for Brandom, by inference. However, Loeffler rightly stresses that this perspective does not make Brandom a radical anti-representationalist like Richard Rorty and Huw Price, who try to completely eliminate the notion of representation from our vocabularies. Brandom's anti-representationalism, as a matter of fact, is limited to the explanatory role played by representation, but it is also committed to explaining (in nonrepresentational terms) the representational import of conceptual contents, the representational dimension of thought and talk.

Brandom calls this view "local" anti-representationalism as opposed to its "global" variants. Loeffler rightly emphasizes how this view distances Brandom's perspective from other neo-pragmatist views. In fact, Brandom preserves a fundamental role for representational locutions, for example, de re ascriptions of propositional attitudes, within discursive practice. Loeffler then reconstructs how, for Brandom, the representational import of conceptual content must be understood in the more general scorekeeping model of discursive practice, as a dimension relative to the moves made in linguistic interactions. Finally, the chapter explores how representational locutions -- and, in general, the representational dimension of thought and talk -- are helpful in explaining the success of communicative interactions in a context of perspectival discursive commitments and semantic holism.

Chapter Eight is dedicated to, arguably, the most discussed topic in Brandom's philosophy, the objectivity of conceptual norms in a context of perspectival discursive commitments. Loeffler's reconstruction is, in my opinion, the most complete in the literature: he does not just reconstruct a general dimension of the problem, but patiently presents it as structurally multisided. It is here that we first find the formal conception of objectivity defended in Making It Explicit; for Brandom, objectivity depends on the distinction between correct applications of concepts and applications that are merely taken to be correct.

Loeffler then dedicates a section to a more recent Brandomian perspective on objectivity that depends on an original analogy between conceptual norms and laws in a system of common law. In this perspective, there is a double temporal dimension of normativity, one dealing with past applications of conceptual norms (analogous to past legal judgments) and another dealing with new applications of conceptual norms (analogous to new legal judgements, which may diverge from past ones). This move is important in dealing with phenomenalism about norms -- the idea that norms depend on normative attitudes -- and these temporal dimensions explain how such norms can be both dependent on, and independent from, normative attitudes.

At this point, Loeffler introduces semantic underdetermination as the Hegelian view that Brandom endorses in his spelling out of the common-law analogy. Even though past scorekeeping attitudes normatively constrain the present judge's application of norms, they do not metaphysically necessitate a single correct system of acknowledged assertional and substitutional commitments regarding this particular case. Here, Loeffler offers an original perspective to defend such a view; the idea is to connect it with the semantic eliminativism of the interpretationist perspectives of Quine and Davidson. Even though Loeffler is optimistic about its feasibility, he nonetheless recognizes how Brandom's perspective differs from this eliminativist proposal.

Loeffler then introduces another layer of Brandom's account of objectivity, that dedicated to objective facts, based on the idea that facts are true claims. This is, very roughly, the idea that our claims and beliefs aim at answering to the largely mind-independent world. As Loeffler says, this conception of objectivity seems to imply that the mind-independent world constrains our scorekeeping activities. Very roughly, this means that reality constrains thought as conceptually structured: this means embracing a kind of conceptual realism where the world is conceptual and normative. Here Loeffler characterizes Brandom as also a modal realist, and not just as a conceptual one: this is problematic without further qualifications, since Brandom does not defend the actual existence of possible worlds.

Loeffler's book is particularly thorough in its presentation of Brandom's thought, a feature that makes it very useful for scholars and students; it is a nice introduction to the main themes and problems of Brandom's philosophy. This feature, however, comes with a price: the book, for this very reason, is not particularly original in its discussion of the problems that it presents, even if the book's organization is interestingly original. This renders it quite different from other books, such as Wanderer's. To conclude, Loeffler's book is a very useful guide to Brandom's philosophy and its open problems, and for this reason it is a valuable instrument to scholars of Brandom's philosophy.

[1] J. Wanderer, Robert Brandom, Acumen, 2008.

[2] R. Brandom, From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom reads Sellars, Harvard University Press 2015.

[3] See G. Turbanti, Robert Brandom’s Normative Inferentialism, Johns Benjamins, 2017, for a detailed presentation of such vocabularies.