Breakdown of Will

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Ainslie, George, Breakdown of Will, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 258+ xi pp, $21.00 (pbk.), ISBN 0521596947.

Reviewed by Dion Scott-Kakures, Scripps College and Claremont Graduate University


The title of George Ainslie’s arresting Breakdown of Will is a double (at least) entendre. Most centrally, the title refers to those patterns of self-defeating behavior (akrasia, addictions, procrastination, compulsions, etc.) that Ainslie has stalked for many years. Just as important, though, the “breakdown” in Breakdown of Will refers to Ainslie’s own fascinating effort to break the will down, in the way one breaks down a mechanical device into its constituent parts in order to understand its construction and operation. The will, for Ainslie, is neither a mysterious organ nor an idle cog; it is a bargaining situation in which temporally distinct populations of partially cooperating interests compete for selection and, so, for survival. Breakdown of Will offers, via the investigation, diagnosis and explanation of various forms of irrationality and an account of the nature and the variable efficacy of self-control, nothing less than a genealogy of rational agency itself. In short, Breakdown of Will is heady stuff.

Readers of Ainslie’s earlier, provocative, difficult, and massive Picoeconomics: The Strategic Interaction of Successive Motivational States within the Person (1992) will encounter much that is familiar here. Indeed, Ainslie notes in his Preface that he wrote Breakdown of Will as a result of his editor’s invitation to summarize that earlier work. He writes that “[this] book is simpler, and, I think clearer. I have also added a great deal, both of research and theory …” (ix). There’s no doubt that Ainslie is right about the fact that this is no mere summary of Picoeconomics. Moreover, the presentation here, though engaging, is less quirky, more direct, and more sharply focused than that of the earlier work. My sense is that readers are apt to find Ainslie—who is a psychiatrist—dealing here more straightforwardly with issues that squarely engage philosophical attention. This is not, however, to say that Breakdown of Will is an undemanding read.

For Ainslie, the key to seeing our way through to his picoeconomic (or micro-microeconomic) perspective is to fix our attention squarely on the sort of behavior whereby human beings, all too frequently, destroy their own lives. Consider, for example, John Cheever’s regard for his own alcoholism:

Year after year I read in [my journals] that I am drinking too much … I waste more days, I suffer deep pangs of guilt, I wake up at three in the morning with the feelings of a temperance worker. Drink, its implements, environments, and effects all seem disgusting. And yet each noon I reach for the whiskey bottle. (1990, 54)

Much of the early portion of the book is taken up with displaying how thin, by Ainslie’s lights, our understanding is of such irrational behavior. We haven’t, according to Ainslie, really done much better than Plato’s talk of a battle between reason and appetite—reason is sometimes the victor, at other times appetite triumphs; but this intuitive picture produces no explanation of why one faculty is the winner in any particular contest. (Ainslie writes: “While science stands by, mystified, people keep wrecking their own lives” (28).)

Cheever’s problem isn’t that he is subject to some form of visceral impulse fundamentally distinct from motivation in general. No, Cheever’s problem is that he is subject to a reversal of preferences. (We’ll see below that, according to Ainslie, Cheever suffers from another—more serious—problem: he’s not very skilled at intertemporal bargaining.) This fact about Cheever is hardly an oddity, though. As Ainslie puts it: “People indeed maximize their prospective reward, but they discount their prospects using a different formula than the one that’s obviously rational” (28). The traditional expected utility model presumes that my preferences are consistent. If Cheever prefers the smaller, earlier reward (whiskey), at a particular time (noon) to the larger, later reward (productivity in the evening, or quality time with his daughter), it is assumed that he will do so at every time. In short, the standard view is that actors’ discount curves (the rate at which one discounts future goods) are exponential. (This is one reason standard utility theory would seem to have no use for the will.)

But while Ainslie is a utility theorist, he is a heretical one, and throughout much of Part I of Breakdown of Will, he marshals an impressive body of evidence (animal studies, experiments with human subjects, as well as clinical observations, and neuroanatomical data) in support of the claim that our discount curve is not exponential but hyperbolic—more deeply bowed than the exponential curve. Here is one picturesque illustration of hyperbolic discounting at play:

If I ask a room full of people to imagine that they’ve won a contest and can choose between a certified check for $100 that they can cash immediately and a postdated certified check for $200 that they can’t cash for three years, more than half the people usually say that they would rather have the $100 now. If I then ask what about $100 in six years versus $200 in nine years, virtually everyone picks the $200. But this is the same choice seen at six years greater distance. (33)

This is the “warp” in how we evaluate the future. Its presence is clearly visible in the case of someone like Cheever. In the early morning he prefers abstinence to intoxication, but then as noon approaches, he comes to prefer drink to the later larger reward, and then in the aftermath of his drinking (a choice that makes unavailable the later larger reward of, for example, an evening spent at work), he comes again to prefer abstinence, with, as he writes “the feelings of a temperance worker.” In the language of the fable of the ant and the grasshopper, we are all natural grasshoppers—seduced by temporally nearer but smaller rewards. For Ainslie, then, the puzzle is not so much the explanation of irrational behavior, but rather the explanation of (what we’re apt to regard as) rational behavior. Rational agency is an achievement—a matter of getting ourselves to choose as if our discount curves were exponential. In sum, then, an akratic agent, such as Cheever, does, in fact, maximize expected reward; it’s just that he discounts “in highly bowed curves.” (There is a question here it, seems to me, as to whether this counts as an explanation of akrasia, rather than merely a representation of it.)

This way of casting the problem sets the stage for Ainslie’s break down of the will in the second sense noted above. For, over time, someone like Cheever will come to view his own behavior as self-defeating. Indeed, he’ll often make plans in the morning that he’ll frustrate in the afternoon. If he is ever to satisfy his longer-term interests and secure the temporally more distant but objectively larger reward, he must, somehow, take into consideration that his goal of productivity in the evening is likely to become unpreferred through a certain temporal period during the afternoon. In short, the problem is how to “get through” the period during which he prefers drink to abstinence. This, we’ll see, is a matter of intertemporal bargaining between an individual’s temporal distinct interests.

Before turning to that issue, I want briefly to consider Ainslie’s appeal to hyperbolic discounting. The first, and, perhaps, obvious, thing to note, is that hyperbolic discounting describes a form of diachronic instability or inconsistency (Elster, 1999, 429). But this will come as a disappointment to those who regard akrasia, for example, as a problem of synchronic inconsistency or irrationality. That is, after all, meant to be a telling difference between the akrates and the intemperate or impulsive individual. The former, even while reaching for the bottle, holds or judges that there is another action open to him that is, all things told, better or more rational, or, indeed, preferable. The latter, on the other hand, is apt to think “What the heck” before reaching for the whiskey. I don’t suggest that Ainslie doesn’t have the resources to explain the appearance of synchronic inconsistency. (I suggest only that the phenomenon explained isn’t the phenomenon many had in mind.) Indeed, there is a fascinating discussion in Chapter seven in which Ainslie argues that the akratic’s belief that there is a better or more valued action available to her is just a bargaining ploy—in this case, a failed one—a “pale” personal rule. (“People want,” Ainslie writes, “to characterize value as something we discern, for the very reason—my argument goes—that framing the rule as a belief will make it more stable” (110).) Remarkably, then, our appeal to reasons is a kind of talisman, one that adds incentive in support of our longer-term interests. One is left—I was left—wishing for more about this important matter.

Ainslie’s appeal to hyperbolic discounting isn’t limited to akrasia and addiction. Indeed, the experience of such preference reversals will differ according to how long they last. Some, “compulsions” (“workaholism” and miserliness), Ainslie terms them, may last years. Others, such as those distinctive of addictions, last hours or days. But, in other cases, the cycles of preference reversal may be very rapid indeed. As Ainslie argues in Chapter four, what we experience as deliberate behavior is only one species of reward-sensitive behavior. In this way, pains, itches, and emotions, like panic, may be conceived of as reward-dependent behaviors. (Hyperbolic discounting, the fact that we are subject to preference reversal, predicts, or at least makes space for, “a split between reward and pleasure” (59). Strictly, for Ainslie, reward just is whatever it is that increases the probability of the occurrence of the behavior or process it follows.) These experiences (or at least most of them) aren’t mandatory—think of the ways in which we distract ourselves from pains or panic attacks (with mixed success). Something is seducing or luring us into the experience or behavior. But in certain cases, pain is certainly one, the lure is followed so rapidly by the non-reward, that there’s no sense of our participation in the process. Ainslie’s discussion here is a tour de force. What Ainslie is offering us, then, is a unified theory of behavior, not one that must appeal to the mechanism of classical conditioning as a patch to deal with generally aversive behavior.

The chief problem, as I noted above is how, given that I am subject to hyperbolic discounting, I am ever to satisfy my longer-range interests? Interests compete for reward, but the trouble for Cheever’s interest in being productive in the evening is that the temporarily ascendant interest in drinking trumps it in the afternoon. But interests, at different points on time’s arrow, can engage in tactics that render more likely their own satisfaction. Ainslie considers four such tactics: extrapsychic commitments, the manipulation of attention, the preparation of emotion, and, most important as it is the tactic that generates the experience of the will, personal rules. I’ll briefly mention the first, and then turn to the last.

The first is, of course, familiar from Jon Elster’s (not to mention Homer’s) discussion of Ulysses and the sirens. What’s crucial to extrapsychic commitment is this: a longer-term interest (in the typical case) might, while it is dominant, make it impossible or at least more difficult to choose the temporarily preferred alternative; in addition, the dominant interest might somehow add to the incentive bearing on some future choice. If I’m apt to be a spendthrift in a certain store, I might give my wife my wallet before the shopping-trip. Or, if I’ve vowed to quit smoking on a certain day, I can tell everyone I know, adding public humiliation to the stakes at risk in the choice to smoke or not to smoke in future. These tactics don’t require much conceptual sophistication. (Ainslie notes that pigeons display such self-binding behavior.) They’re also not particularly flexible and invite certain predictable responses by competing interests: if I’ve told everyone I’m quitting cigarettes, I might find myself, when I prefer to smoke, taking long solitary drives to country to indulge.

Hyperbolic discounting does, however give rise to another tactic, at least in conceptually sophisticated humans beings: personal rules—a tool that, Ainslie argues, emerges from intertemporal bargaining and gives rise to what we describe as “willpower” and “the will.” Indeed, given that it will become temporarily unpreferred, what enforces my resolve not to smoke or my intention to complete that overdue review? As we know, it seems to take effort. What explains this?

In brief, Ainslie’s solution is to point out that I must come to choose in terms of categories or bunches of successive rewards rather than in terms of a single reward. Put it this way: even when Cheever reaches for the whiskey bottle (after all, at noon he prefers whiskey to productivity in the evening), it’s likely that he prefers the prospect of a future series of abstentions to a future series of successive intoxications (cf. Bratman, 1999). Put another way, even while preferring drink now to work later, Cheever prefers a life of thoughtful productivity to a drunkard’s life. As Ainslie notes, “the incentives for choosing between these two categories of rewards will be the summed expected values of the series of reward” (82). This works, Ainslie emphasizes, only if the shape of the discount curve is highly bowed, i.e., hyperbolic. So this manner of choosing—categorically, in bunches—is the basis of the personal rule. It is for Ainslie the source of the notion that we, sometimes at least, choose on principle. Of course, I’ll be motivated to stick to principle, to my personal rule (for example, “Don’t have a drink before 9:00 p.m.”) only if there’s a basis for thinking that I’ll be consistently so motivated in the future. The basis of the choice is just this expectation. If I believe I’m not going to succeed in getting the series of larger later rewards, I’ll drink up, since I prefer drink now to productivity now.

As Ainslie is at pains to show (and as all our experience seconds), however, such a maneuver does not extinguish the lure of smaller, nearer rewards. The problem is not, according to Ainslie, how to explain the way in which such categorical choice “recruits motivational support for long-range interests” (87). Human beings can look ahead to survey a future series of successive rewards—and the summation effect, noted above, does the rest. The problem is that even as Cheever prefers the future series of abstentions to drinkings, what he most prefers (or, rather, what he most prefers at noon) is the future series of abstentions and drinking now. Here is Ainslie’s elegant formulation of the hard problem of the will: “Acting in my long-range interest, how do I keep my short-range interest from repeatedly proposing an exception to my rule, ‘just this once?’” (ibid.).

Well, the short answer is that too many exceptions to the personal rule spoil the expectation that I’ll succeed in getting the series of larger rewards. The will or willpower depends upon my regarding my current choices as precedents for my future choices. A really good excuse doesn’t shake my expectation that I’ll abstain in the future, since it isn’t reasonably regarded by me as a precedent. But too many defections, in the language of the repeated prisoner’s dilemma that Ainslie deploys, undoes my expectation that I’ll succeed in securing the series of larger rewards. My motivation for cleaving to my principle is a matter of my saving the expectation that I will stick to it in the future. In this way, for Ainslie, self-control is a matter of reasonable self-prediction.

Throughout Part II this picture is developed in compelling detail. (Chapter seven includes a wonderfully persuasive description of the ways in which the model predicts the properties traditionally attributed to the will.) If there’s reason to worry about the effort to build the will and rational agency from such limited resources, I suspect Michael Bratman’s (1999) worry in response to the earlier Picoeconomics, remains pressing. Too briefly, the worry is this: does my abstaining (or drinking) today give me a practical reason (on the basis of which I can make a rational choice) to abstain tomorrow? I will abstain now only if I can reasonably maintain my expectation of so acting in the future. If I drink now, I risk losing that series of larger rewards by virtue of the ways in which future selves will choose in the light of my current self’s choice to drink. That is, I must now reasonably regard my current choice as a precedent for future choices—a precedent that I can now reasonably take to make more likely my future selves’ defection or cooperation. Again, it’s a matter of aiming to maintain the expectation of future obedience to the personal rule via a current decision to choose in accord with the personal rule. Perhaps the thought is this: tomorrow, struggling with the same choice, I may think: “Well, yesterday I faced the same situation, the same considerations were relevant, etc., and I chose to abstain, so that’s what I’ll do today. What’s more, in acting in this way today, I’ll be in the same position tomorrow.” But this doesn’t seem like deliberation; rather, I seem to be using choices or behavior as evidence, by appeal to which I predict what I’m going to do. Ainslie is certainly right to emphasize that in making such choices what is fundamentally at stake is my credibility to myself (94), a kind of self-trust. After a certain number of lapses of the “just this once” variety, I’m simply not going to take myself seriously. The question is whether the mechanism of intertemporal bargaining alone can provide a rational basis for the expectation that I will continue to choose to abstain. (See pp. 93-95 for what may well be an answer.)

In this already too long review I haven’t (sadly) considered Ainslie’s discussion of the ways in which the will is not an unmixed blessing. That discussion is masterful. Rule-based choice, Ainslie argues, will tend to generate compulsions and rigidity, will magnify lapses, generate self-deception, and undermine appetite. Ultimately, as Ainslie remarks, we’re brought to “the heart of a central human paradox: that the better the will is at getting rewards, the less reward it will finally obtain” (175).

The overall impression produced by Breakdown of Will is astonishment—at its ambition, at the breadth and depth of learning on display, at the power and coherence and all-encompassing nature of Ainslie’s picoeconomic perspective. Ainslie’s immensely impressive achievement cannot be ignored.


Bratman, Michael. “Planning and Temptation,” in The Faces of Intention, Cambridge University Press, 1999.

Cheever, John. “Journals,” The New Yorker, August 13, 1990.

Elster, Jon. “Davidson on Weakness of Will and Self-Deception,” in The Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Hahn, Lewis Edwin (ed.), Open Court, 1999.