Evolution, Chance, and God: Understanding the Relationship between Evolution and Religion

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Brendan Sweetman, Evolution, Chance, and God: Understanding the Relationship between Evolution and Religion, Bloomsbury, 2015, 237pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781628929843.

Reviewed by Christopher Mirus, University of Dallas


Brendan Sweetman has undertaken to provide a balanced, generally accessible book on the relation between evolutionary theory and Christian theism. His long introduction to the issues is unremarkable, and his own subsequent approach is based on the conviction that the natural world is ordinarily subject to complete causal and indeed physical determinism. Readers with little previous exposure to evolutionary theory and its religious implications may find the book helpful; philosophers are more likely to find it frustrating. Anyone who requires more argument for determinism than vague references to the laws of physics, the everyday practice of science, and the principle of sufficient reason will be disappointed, as will anyone looking for some indication of how free will might fit into an otherwise deterministic natural order.

The first half of the book is introductory. Sweetman first describes the current cultural debate concerning evolution and situates his own contribution within it (chapter 1). He then turns to evolutionary theory itself, considering the basic concepts (2), evidence for (3), reactions to, and implications of the theory (4). The remainder of the book contains an informal philosophical assessment of evolutionary theory itself (5-6) and of its implications for religious belief (7-8). After offering a general argument for physical determinism (5), he then contends that when viewed as a strictly deterministic process, evolution looks as though it must have been designed with a view to the emergence of living things in general and human beings in particular (6). He then considers divine action in nature (7), and finally addresses a series of questions regarding design, evil, morality, and free will (8).

In considering how God acts in nature, he argues that naturalism is unworthy of rational assent in that it fails to provide an ultimate explanation for any physical event, that God may and in fact does intervene from time to time in the natural order, and that an evolutionary process created by God is unlikely to involve chance in any real sense. In his final chapter, he disagrees with intelligent design theory on the grounds that a deterministic evolutionary process designed by God requires no special divine interventions along the way. He also argues that evolution does not exacerbate the problem of evil, that naturalistic explanations of morality undermine the objectivity of the moral order, and that the obvious existence of human freedom testifies against naturalism.

It is clear from the beginning that Sweetman's intended audience is the traditional Christian theist. He is sympathetic to creationists, who take seriously the foundational questions raised by evolutionary theory. He praises those who consider evolution merely compatible with a traditional Christian understanding of God, and who therefore consider evolutionary theory on its own merits. (This seems to involve keeping evolution at arm's length, even if one ends up assenting to it.) Process theologians, on the other hand, often accept evolution as part of a liberal theological, moral, and political agenda. Secularists, of course, simply co-opt evolutionary theory to justify their atheism. Whatever one may think of these assessments, they restrict his audience fairly effectively.

Sweetman is a patient rather than an exciting writer, and this patience suits his goals. For example, one important goal is to disentangle the scientific status of evolutionary theory from its philosophical and theological implications, and so to cultivate in his readers the ability to think clearly and calmly about a controversial topic. Before turning to the religious implications of evolution, therefore, he devotes two chapters to a nonpolemical overview of the theory itself. He concludes that evolution as a whole is neither an observable fact nor mere speculation. It is instead a well-confirmed scientific theory, generally accepted by specialists in the field and by their peers in other scientific disciplines, and so worthy of rational assent by others. (His presentation is rather stale, however: he discusses Darwin at some length, DNA only briefly, and the crucial recent field of evolutionary developmental biology not at all.) He prefaces this overview with a brief general discussion of scientific knowledge.

Sweetman's discussion of the basic issues is reasonably balanced. He considers evolution a well-confirmed scientific theory that nevertheless has plenty of work left to do. He explicitly presupposes the existence of a divine creator, while noting that the philosopher must defend this position elsewhere. He acknowledges the claims of biblical faith, but rejects literal interpretations of the creation stories in Genesis. He argues that the evolutionary process is designed by God as a whole, and therefore requires no special divine interventions.

There are, however, aspects of his discussion that its intended audience may find off-putting. Readers uncomfortable with a nonliteral reading of the biblical creation stories will find their concerns dismissed in little more than half a page, although Sweetman notes that he has discussed this topic at length elsewhere. More importantly, he bases his philosophical approach to evolution and its religious implications almost entirely on his physical determinism, which he rounds off with the metaphor of the cosmos as a grand machine and softens with exceptions for miracles and human freedom. Although some readers will be too troubled by the role of chance in evolution to bat an eye at this strategy, others may wonder whether the old mechanical philosophy is ideally suited to play peacemaker between science and religion.

Sweetman's application of his determinism to evolutionary theory at first seems straightforward. If evolution operates largely by chance, he argues, then its outcomes are probably not intended by a creator. At minimum, we face a serious challenge in understanding how these outcomes might be subject to divine providence. If, however, all natural processes are fully deterministic -- if the appearance of chance is always a function of our ignorance -- then evolutionary outcomes might well be subject to the designs of a God capable of setting laws and initial conditions for the universe as a whole. And if cosmic history has as its predetermined outcome the emergence of beings that are conscious, morally responsible, and free, then it is not only possible but likely that the laws and initial conditions governing this history were designed.

To secure the determinism that his approach to evolutionary theory requires, Sweetman relies on two arguments: first, the practice of science presupposes causal determinism, and second, every occurrence must logically have a cause.

His clearest statement of the first argument comes in his discussion of quantum mechanics:

I do not think there are many scientists who believe that chance occurs in physical processes at least at the working level of science. Every scientist operates with a deterministic view of the physical world at the working level (irrespective of which theoretical perspective they might favor); indeed it is hard to see how one could do science if one did not operate with this assumption. (143; emphasis original)

It is rather unclear, however, what he means by "the working level of science." Does this level include quantum mechanics? Does it include reliable technology based on quantum mechanics, but not the measurement of individual quantum events? It is also unclear why he thinks the practice of science presupposes a causal determinism strict enough to predetermine the exact outcome of the evolution of life on earth.

The looseness of this first argument might perhaps be explained by the force Sweetman grants to his second argument for determinism, the clearest statement of which also comes in his discussion of quantum mechanics:

the thesis that nature is deterministic is the most rational one to adopt on the grounds that all of our experience is against the view that the behaviors of particles could be indeterminate in themselves. From a logical point of view, it is not clear that such a notion is even intelligible. And if a notion seems to be logically unintelligible, we should be very reluctant to accept it. (142)

Later, he adds that "I cannot see how an effect could come about in the universe if it has no prior cause, and if there is a prior cause, I cannot see how the effect could be otherwise than it is" (178).

Unfortunately, this appeal to something like the principle of sufficient reason raises questions about Sweetman's understanding of human freedom and of divine action. Free will, he writes, is "outside the deterministic process of cause and effect," since free decisions are based on reasons that "do not causally compel me in the scientific sense" (207). Are such decisions therefore exceptions to the logical principle that supports a completely deterministic account of nature? Is the principle in question not that everything requires a deterministic cause, but only that natural or physical events require such causes? If so, why is this a logical truth rather than a particular truth about beings that lack intelligence and freedom?

The attempt to support a deterministic interpretation of the natural order by appealing to something like the principle of sufficient reason runs into deeper problems when we consider divine action in nature. The basic difficulty is that the God of traditional Christian theism is perfectly capable of bringing about physical events in the absence of deterministic physical causes. Sweetman himself recognizes this fact. Not only does he accept the possibility of miracles; he also observes that "the only possible way for an effect to occur by chance is for God to intervene and bring it about, but then this is not genuine chance" (178).

From a certain point of view, this last statement is perfectly reasonable. One might reasonably accept the principle of sufficient reason, and therefore hold that there is no chance in any absolute sense. One might further hold when a natural event appears to occur by chance, it either (i) has deterministic natural causes of which we are ignorant or (ii) results directly from a divine decision. As soon as one allows the second possibility, however, it becomes perfectly conceivable that the occurrence of determinate outcomes in the absence of deterministic natural causes should be an everyday part of the natural order. From a purely scientific perspective, moreover, it would be correct to describe such outcomes as occurring by chance, even though their occurrence is determined by divine providence. It would also be misleading to describe God as "intervening" in such cases, not only because the outcomes might have real, nondeterministic natural causes, but also because the outcomes would be ordinary natural occurrences.

Similarly, by the way, one might also decline to follow Sweetman in treating every deterministic causal chain, however unusual or convoluted, as somehow aiming at its own outcome. One might prefer to follow Aristotle, identifying and individuating causal processes in term of typical rather than actual outcomes, and then attributing to chance goal-like outcomes that are due to the intersection of distinct causal processes so individuated. Outcomes of this sort, too, would still be subject to divine providence.

Now Sweetman is probably correct in supposing that many of his opponents are committed to the existence of chance in a much deeper sense -- that they wish, in other words, to treat the evolution of life in general and of human beings in particular as undetermined by any cause whatsoever, whether natural or divine. Sweetman's case against chance in this deeper sense, however, appears to rely on two weak arguments, one of which seems deeply incompatible with his own principles.

In the end, Sweetman does not appear to have thought carefully enough about issues such as the distinction between primary and secondary causality and the requirements for considering a natural process goal-directed. This looseness of thought affects other parts of his discussion as well -- for example, his account of the distinction between theory and observation in science. Every popular book must simplify, of course, and Sweetman's voice remains moderate and reasonable by comparison with many of those with which he disagrees. Yet I suspect that this could have been a more rigorous book without sacrificing its present virtues.