Brentano's Mind

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Mark Textor, Brentano's Mind, Oxford University Press, 302 pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780199685479.

Reviewed by Guillaume Fréchette, University of Salzburg


Over the last forty years, mainly as a result of the long-term influence of Chisholm's pioneering work, much has been written on Brentano's philosophy of mind, but also on his ontology, his metaphysics, his theory of values, and his epistemology. Many different "Brentanian" accounts of the mind and its intentionality have been offered in the last few years, which are often meant to provide and use an historical background for a view that has been developed quite independently of Brentano. Mark Textor's book goes the other way round, starting from what Brentano has to say about consciousness and intentionality, and then trying to "bring out something true and philosophically illuminating in Brentano's thinking about the mind" (7). Although Textor aims at preserving faithfulness to the texts and historical accuracy, such considerations are not the primary aims of this book.

The book makes five central claims.

1. Intentionality is an implausible mark of the mental. Following Textor, Brentano should be considered a primitivist about intentionality. Why? He holds that the two main characterizations of intentionality offered by Brentano -- in terms of immanent object, as he proposed in the Psychology, or in terms of a relation with a mediating entity, as he proposed in the Vienna period -- both seem to give rise to an infinite regress: "for if we need to think of an immanent object in order to think a presented object, we need another act with another immanent object to think of the first immanent object, and so on" (54). What are the other options to explain this mark of the mental? Textor discusses Chisholm's criterion for a mental phenomenon, an explanation in terms of correctness or accuracy conditions, and finally the notion of aspectual shape as an explanans of intentionality. According to his view, none of these options succeed, since none of them are applicable to all mental phenomena. This leaves Brentano with no other choice than arguing for primitivism: intentionality is a mark of the mental which we cannot really explain, but can only point at. In some passages, as Textor shows, Brentano seems to realize that primitivism is the better choice. However, Textor disagrees with primitivism as a way of fixing a mark of the mental: "the distinction between the mental and the physical can be clarified further" (87).

2. One vehicle, two objects. Having ruled out intentionality as a plausible mark of the mental, Textor argues that consciousness, on Brentano's own account, is a plausible mark of the mental. Why? Only mental phenomena are conscious, i.e. inwardly perceived, and in being inwardly perceived, they are not given from a perspective, but are given in full, without adumbrations. Textor remarks that this is more a Husserlian than a Brentanian mark, but he argues that Brentano's conception of inner perception as distinct from inner observation carried the seed of this mark.

The way to get to this conclusion is complex. The first step in Textor's reconstruction of Brentano is to secure the Brentanian claim that consciousness is a mark of the mental. Which claim is that? Textor argues that it is the claim that something is a mental act iff there is a presentation of it (43), and not the claim that all mental acts are conscious, as is often believed. To capture the difference between these two claims, Textor distinguishes between the Regress Argument and the Duplication Argument. The Regress Argument goes back to Aristotle, and could be reformulated roughly as follows (my reformulation differs from Textor's):

The Regress Argument

(T) Perceiving that one perceives x (Ppx) is distinct from perceiving x (px);

(1)       If (px), then (Ppx)
(2)       (px)
(3)       therefore (Ppx)
(4)       If (Ppx), then (PPpx) . . . and so on ad infinitum
(5)       ∴ For finite beings, (T) must be false.

The Regress Argument, Textor argues, has been mistakenly understood in the literature to be Brentano's master argument for the non-distinctness of (px) and (Ppx). In a nutshell, it aims to show that distinguishing between the mental act and the awareness of it (as in (T)) leads to an infinite regress. The regress threat, according to Textor, is meant only to show that our basic intuition that we are always conscious of being conscious of our seeing when we consciously see cannot be preserved if (Ppx) is distinct from (px). However, the basic intuition presupposed in the Regress Argument would assume too much: one could argue, on independent grounds, that (1) is not always true.

The Duplication Argument assumes only that it happens at least sometimes that, when one perceives something, one also perceives that one perceives. Why? Brentano grounds his argument on the premise that "no one can really doubt that it happens that we are conscious of a mental phenomenon while it is present in us" (PES-E, 97/PES-G, 176). The argument runs as follows (here again, my reformulation differs from Textor's):

The Duplication Argument

(T1) The presentation of the presentation of the sound (pps) that makes the presentation of the sound (ps) conscious is distinct from (ps), and
(T2) (pps) is directed at (ps)

(i)     (pps) is also directed at the sound (s)
(ii)    (pps) and (ps) are directed at (s)
(iii)   It is not the case that (s) is presented twice
(iv)  ∴ (T1) is false, but (T2) is true.

The Duplication Argument aims to show that, starting from the assumption that we sometimes are aware of our perceptions when we perceive, there is in such cases only one act, (pps), but there are two different objects: the content of the perception, (s), and the act itself (the conscious perception), (ps). The content of the perception, (s), is not duplicated, since the double direction of (pps) is spelled out in terms of (i) direction at (ps) and (ii) self-direction at (pps) together with (ps) and (s).

3. Joint self-direction. The latter point (ii) is spelled out in Chapter 6. Here, the threat of infinite regress again arises: if we say that inner consciousness of hearing, (pps), and the hearing itself, (ps), are linked by an intentional relation, as Textor suggests, then we must have some knowledge of this intentional relation, which would become the third intentional object of a further inner consciousness, and so on. Textor suggests that Brentano is immune to this objection because the hearing is not the only object of the consciousness of hearing; rather, the consciousness is jointly of some acts; (s) together with (ps), and possibly others, like seeing the singer singing at the same time as hearing her sing the note, etc. One way of framing Textor's view would be to say, using Brentanian terminology, that the self-direction involved in consciousness points at a part together with the whole. As Brentano puts it: "the consciousness which accompanies the presentation of the tone is a consciousness not so much of this presentation as of the whole mental act in which the sound is presented, and in which the consciousness itself is co-given" (PES-E, 100/ PES-G, 182). The regress threat only arises "if one adds that one is aware of the awareness of hearing F in particular" (136). In other words, (pps) and (ps) can be said to be linked together by means of intentionality, but since (ps) in this case is not given to (pps) in particular, but as a part of a whole, this further "internal" regress does not arise.

If consciousness is an intentional relation, as Textor holds, and if consciously hearing F is a mental act directed at F and at the whole of which hearing F is itself a part, what does it mean for a part to be directed at the whole? Textor avoids this question in modelling the structure of consciously hearing F on the structure of sentences with plural demonstratives: in "We will be late," I am not referring to myself and the whole, but rather "I refer to some people of which I am one" (121). By doing so, he pushes a deflationist reading of the part/whole structure of consciousness in Brentano, which is actually required by his reading of the Regress Argument as a mere deterrent to those inclined to see hearing F and consciously hearing F as distinct.

4. Being possibly given without adumbration as the mark of the mental. Having secured the case for "one vehicle, two objects" in terms of "one vehicle, two objects, one of which is the vehicle itself," Textor goes on to argue in Chapters 7 and 8 that Brentano's thesis that inner perception cannot become inner observation is not only plausible, but actually displays a mark of the mental: "something is a mental phenomenon if, and only if, awareness of it cannot become observation" (171). Brentano did not investigate whether this thesis could serve as a mark of the mental, but Husserl did. Chapter 8 therefore aims at a reconstruction of Husserl's account and pleads for a Husserlian account in this respect. In other words, given the interpretation of the Duplication Argument provided by Textor and the "joint self-direction" that comes with it, Brentano had the tools needed to construe a mark of the mental.

5. Enjoyment and consciousness are mutually illuminating. The second and last part of the book aims to strengthen the case for "one vehicle, two objects" by investigating the case of affective acts, which Textor labels "enjoyment." He argues for the thesis of Brentano and Aristotle that we enjoy activities, not objects: when I say that I enjoy wine, what I actually mean is that I enjoy drinking wine. If enjoyments are enjoyments of activities, then the resemblance between the structure of consciousness and the structure of enjoyment is obvious: consciousness of hearing F is directed at the hearing, just as enjoying drinking wine is directed at drinking wine. The case of enjoyment helps to support the point for the case of perception in the following way: "There is no real distinction between a perceiving on the one hand and distinct enjoyment in perceiving (thinking) on the other hand. For example, hearing a note and enjoying hearing a note are one act under different descriptions" (224). Therefore, enjoying drinking wine, like the consciousness of hearing F, is of itself "on the side," but is also directed at the wine (or the sound).

This view presupposes, however, that Brentano saw acts of love and hate as literally directed at the object of the underlying presentation. But this does not seem right. For Brentano, feeling a pain in my foot is a haptic sensation of some localized quality (a sensation of the lower senses), which is accompanied by a so-called Mitempfindung, or co-sensation, which "affectively colours" the sensing. Hearing a tone and hearing a tone with affect (or "enjoying the hearing," as Textor would put it) are in fact two different phenomena: the first is deprived of Mitempfindung, while the second is an enjoyment thanks to the Mitempfindung.

By arguing that Brentano's claim that consciousness is a mark of the mental is simply the claim that something is a mental act iff there is a presentation of it, Textor can avoid the consequence that would otherwise arise from the claim that all mental acts are conscious, namely, that you cannot hear a tone without enjoying (or disenjoying) your hearing. Indeed, Brentano defended this view in the Psychology, but abandoned it soon after.

All these claims deserve more attention, but for the sake of brevity, I will address only the first two claims:

Ad 1: The three objections raised by Textor against the use of aspectual shape as part of the explanans of intentionality (68-69) are not fully convincing. The first objection to aspectual shape is that an infinite being could have an all-round knowledge of the referent; if this is the case, then there is at least one mode of presentation which is not incomplete. But why should an infinite being acquire knowledge of the referent by modes of presentation? The second objection presupposes that there are cases of awareness with no mode of presentation, as suggested by Husserl: "awareness of a mental act does not require grasping a mode of presentation" (69). However, the objection presupposes that, for Brentano, inner consciousness is an intentional relation in the same sense that hearing is an intentional relation to what is heard, and it is not obvious that he held this view (more on this below). The third objection suggests, along the lines of Molnar, that we can imagine a machine that takes various two-dimensional objects as input and gives as output a measurement of the length of their sides. There is a sense, following Molnar, in which the machine is able to pick out equilateral triangles, but since it is not sensitive to the magnitude of the angles, it makes sense to say that the machine has some mode of presentation of equilateral triangles (measuring the lengths of the sides) which is distinct from the equiangular mode of presentation of the same objects. This, Textor suggests, would be enough for an explanans of intentionality in terms of aspectual shape, and it would obviously be a problem for "Brentano's Thesis," since only mental phenomena are supposed to exhibit aspectual shape. Certainly, a Fregean mode of presentation is by nature partial, but it is meant to pick out a thing, not an undetermined set of two-dimensional objects, as presupposed in this case. As Crane puts it: "A state of mind's having aspectual shape is a matter of its partial presentation of a thing."[1]

Aspectual shape as an explanans of intentionality is thus easily defeated. However, Brentano was in fact sympathetic to an account of intentionality in terms of aspectual shape at some stages in his development. It could have been useful to adjust the objections to Brentano's arguments for such an account.

Ad 2. The Duplication Argument also has its difficulties, since it presupposes (i) that (pps) has two objects: (ps) and (s), which is not obvious. In cases of hallucination, what is your hearing directed at? To handle such cases as well as veridical cases, Brentano's strategy in the Vienna period was to suggest that in inner perception, you are not directed at the object (the singing birds), but you are aware of it through the correlate of the act (the "heard birds"). This subtle point in Brentano's account of correlates as distinct from objects in inner perception has already been discussed many times in the recent literature on Brentano (Chrudzimski 2004, Sauer 2006, Antonelli 2009/2015, to mention only a few). Textor takes it for granted: he suggests that Brentano does not need to say that (pps) and (ps) are directed twice at (s): in his reconstruction, (pps) is directed at the correlate of (ps), while (ps) is directed at (s): Brentano could therefore account for the phenomenologically intuitive point (iii) and reject (T1). (pps) and (ps) are just two descriptions of one and the same mental act.

This seems to me a very charitable reconstruction of Brentano's basic idea that the hearing and the consciousness of the hearing form a single mental act, based essentially on the reconstruction of the Duplication Argument. Following this reconstruction, we basically have the same relation of being-directed-at for both the awareness of the hearing and the hearing of the sound. As a result, the relation between your awareness of the hearing and the correlate of your hearing (the "heard sound") is the same on Textor's account as the relation between your hearing and the sound. There is, however, an obvious difference, which Brentano also saw: a correlation is not an intentional relation. We say that there is a correlation between your hearing and the "heard sound" much as we say that there is a correlation between the act of dancing and the dance or, when x is larger than y, between x being larger than y and y being smaller than x, or between poverty and criminality. But we do not say that x's being larger than y is directed at y's being smaller than x, or that poverty is directed at criminality. Strictly speaking, Brentano would not defend (T2). But Textor makes him defend (T2) on the premise that (s) is not presented twice, but that (ps) and (pps) are two descriptions of one single act that presents two different objects: (s) and the correlate of (ps).

Textor's emphasis on the Duplication Argument leads him to maintain that the awareness of an act and the act itself are only conceptually distinct, and to reject both standard one-vehicle views (such as Levine and Caston's) and two-vehicle views (such as Siewert and Kriegel's). On Textor's view, two-vehicle models like Siewert's, suggesting that the hearing of the birds is contained in the awareness of the hearing, are begging the question in their understanding of "being contained."

But Brentano sometimes seems to have a distinction between containment and one-sided separability which is more than a distinction between two descriptions of one and the same thing. Take the following passage from the Psychology:

the sound is the primary object of hearing itself, and . . . the act of hearing itself is the secondary object. Temporally they both occur at the same time, but according to its nature (der Natur der Sache nach), the sound is prior. A presentation of the sound without a presentation of the act of hearing would not be inconceivable, at least prima facie (von vorn herein wenigstens), but a presentation of the act of hearing without a presentation of the sound would be an obvious contradiction. (PES-E, 133, translation modified)

Why and how is such a presentation conceivable at all? It is conceivable that Hesperus is different from Phosphorus, but understanding the distinction in these terms (two descriptions of one single object, the "conceptual distinction" Textor has in mind) does not capture the "priority" of the sound over the hearing emphasized by Brentano. We need something more. Here is one way of accounting for this: we can conceive "hearing F" in two ways: as an event or as a whole. As an event, hearing F has constituents that are "contained" in it in the sense that they are naturally prior to, or more fundamental than, the event itself, without necessarily being diachronically prior to the event, and without necessarily being a proper part of it, but rather are a segment or simply a piece of it.

Compare these two cases:

(a) I am hearing Wagner's Die Meistersinger von Nürnberg with the firm intention of hearing the whole of it, but am interrupted at t1 because of sudden and irreversible complete deafness. Between t0 and t1, I was hearing a segment of Die Meistersinger with the intention of hearing the whole of it.

(b) I am hearing Die Meistersinger with no intention of hearing the whole of it. I shut down the stereo at t1. Between t0 and t1, I was hearing a segment of Die Meistersinger with the intention only to hear that segment.

Intuitively, (a) and (b) describe different intentional acts, and yet it seems that one of their respective constituents (or pieces) coincides: the actual act of hearing involved between t0 and t1 (let's call it (r)). (r) is both a constituent and a part of (a) (along with the intention of hearing the whole of it), whereas it is only a constituent of (b), but not a part. This amounts to saying that, for mental acts at least, we can spell out the part/whole relation between (r) and (a) partly in terms of the containment relation of (r) in (a) (or (b), in this case). This can account for the priority of the sound over the hearing suggested by Brentano and suggests that there is more to Brentano's distinction between hearing F and consciously hearing F than two different descriptions of one single object. Of course, arguing that 'all mental acts are conscious' should not be taken to be the expression of a mark of the mental, and minimizing the role of the Regress Argument, Textor has to be deflationist on talk about containment and the part-whole structure of consciousness. But these are considerable amendments to Brentano's thought.

A few last points on the book's stance. As I mentioned earlier, it aims at bringing out something "true and philosophically illuminating" from Brentano's account of the mind, without neglecting historical accuracy. But historical accuracy is not always a natural bedfellow of true philosophical illumination, and it seems here that the former has been kicked out of bed by the latter more than once. This is the case, in my view, with the tacit presupposition that we are directed towards external objects on Brentano's account of the intentional object. This presupposition is mentioned only in a single footnote (50), and it is the reason why Textor sets aside much of Brentano's epistemology and ontology. For most of Brentano's students however and many of his contemporary readers, including Chisholm, the external object is not what we are conscious of or intentionally directed at. It would be perfectly legitimate to reconstruct his position as an immanent-object theory, while still preserving true philosophical illumination. Investigating the pros and cons of these two positions could have been a way of bringing these two bedfellows closer together.

Textor's stance has many merits, one of which is that it has led to a philosophically very rewarding book. But since it also meant to be a book on Brentano, it might give the reader the impression that Brentano had basically one single unified and stable view of the mind, while in fact many elements, theses, further developments, and alternative views were left aside. Brentano changed his mind on many different matters; this is one of the reasons why his views are philosophically so stimulating, since they constantly consider new arguments and objections. The stance adopted by Textor, however, does not allow the reader to appreciate this dimension of Brentano's thought. Although philosophical illumination is not cheap, this is a high price to pay. It was probably the same consideration that led Textor to ignore most of the secondary literature on Brentano. This may be defensible given the stance of the book, but the strategy leaves the average reader with no tools to discern whether Brentano's alternative views -- or, for that matter, the alternative readings proposed in the secondary literature -- were left aside because they would take the author too far away from his own goal, or because they are simply wrong. Similarly, even for those who are well acquainted with Brentano's thought, it is sometimes difficult to discern whether some of the views presented in the book are (a) reconstructions of Brentano's view; (b) the only view Brentano could reasonably defend), or (c) the author's own views on these issues, quite independently of Brentano's thought.

On an aesthetic note: to my taste, the villain of the story, namely, the mark of intentionality, is defeated too easily, and its alleged clumsiness is sometimes a bit overstated. We expect more from villains, whereas this one falls into most of the traps that were laid for him, even those which are not really harmful. I have already mentioned one of these traps, namely the objections to aspectual shape. Another one is the act/state distinction, which Brentano, according to Textor, could not really account for. The tension in Brentano's view suggested by Textor does not really arise: conviction and desire are perceived in awareness insofar as they are perceived at a time, namely, at the moment of their actualization. Textor sees the possibility, but attributes it to Husserl (182-183).

This book has a great deal of erudition, careful analysis, illuminating examples, and challenging objections, and is written in an excellent and entertaining style. It will be of great value for those interested in Brentano's philosophy from a systematic and historical perspective, and for phenomenologists as well.


Thanks to Johannes Brandl, Denis Fisette, Andrea Marchesi, and Mark Textor for helpful discussions about an earlier draft.


(PES-E): Brentano, F. (2015), Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, Routledge. Translated by A.C. Rancurello, D.B. Terrell, and L.L. McAlister, with a new foreword by Tim Crane.

(PES-G): Brentano, F. (1874), Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt, Ducker & Humblot.

Antonelli, M. (2009), "Franz Brentano et l'inexistence intentionelle", Philosophiques, 36/2, 467-487.

Antonelli, M. (2015), "Franz Brentano's Intentionality Thesis. A New Objection to the Nonsense That Was Dreamt Up and Attributed to Him", Brentano Studien, 13, 23-53.

Chrudzimski, A. (2004), Die Ontologie Franz Brentanos, Kluwer Academic Publishers.

Sauer, W. (2006), "Die Einheit der Intentionalitätskonzeption bei Brentano, Grazer Philosophische Studien, 73, 1-26.

[1] Crane 2001, 21, my emphasis. Also quoted by Textor (68).