Bridging the Gap between Aristotle's Science and Ethics

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Devin Henry and Karen Margrethe Nielson (eds.), Bridging the Gap between Aristotle's Science and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 304pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107010369.

Reviewed by Brennan McDavid, Ormond College, University of Melbourne


In Book 6 of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle presents his conception of practical wisdom. He tells us that it is a state of the soul that is truth-grasping (alethe), "with reason" (meta logou), and practicable concerning things good and bad for human beings (EN 6.5 1140b20-22). In being truth-grasping and "with reason," this psychic state amounts to a form of expertise in matters of human conduct. Possession of this knowledge enables human beings to deliberate well in those situations that call for us to act with regard to what is good and bad for us. It enables us to identify, choose, and perform the particular actions that contribute to or even constitute our own flourishing.

Aristotle's strategy in presenting his conception of practical wisdom is to highlight its features by way of contrast with two other kinds of expertise: scientific knowledge and craft knowledge. He begins this contrastive approach by dividing the rational capacity of the soul into two parts, the "calculative part" (to logistikon) and the "theoretical part" (to epistemonikon), and then designating each of the three kinds of expertise to that part of the rational soul which performs the functions and reasons about the matters which are distinctive of the expertise in question. Practical wisdom and craft knowledge are both identified as belonging to the calculative part because that is the part of the soul by which we "contemplate things that could be otherwise" (EN 6.2 1139a8) and practical wisdom and craft knowledge are both expertise as regards human activity, which can always be otherwise. The former is expertise about things good and bad for human beings, and the latter is expertise about bringing into being some product or end (e.g. a house, a table, or health), so while both of these states of expertise belong to the same part of the rational soul, they are nevertheless distinct states.

Scientific knowledge is identified as the state of expertise that is distinctive of the theoretical or scientific part of the rational soul, the part of ourselves by which we "contemplate the sorts of things among those things which have being whose first principles (archai) cannot be otherwise" (EN 6.2 1139a6-8). Aristotle goes on to explain that this metaphysical feature of the scientific domain (that it has invariable principles) is what makes facts in that domain eligible for featuring in demonstrative syllogisms. We know a fact scientifically, he tells us, when we grasp a demonstrative syllogism that isolates the cause of that fact's being true and when the fact itself is true of necessity. The fact itself is a theorem of science, and the causes are the first principles.

In outlining these significant differences between practical wisdom, craft knowledge, and scientific knowledge, Aristotle makes clear that he thinks of the various forms of expertise as being substantially distinct ways of knowing. They not only carve out their own domains of concern but also depend on different tools of reasoning and even rest in different parts of the soul.

Bridging the Gap between Aristotle's Science and Ethics is a collection that, as a whole, invites readers to reassess just how sharp and deep the above described division between science and ethics runs in Aristotle's philosophy. The editors, Devin Henry and Karen Margrethe Nielsen, direct us in their introduction to consider the place of Aristotle's ethical treatises in relation to the divide. Insofar as the Nicomachean Ethics, Eudemian Ethics, and Politics are all philosophical and theoretical treatments of ethical subject matter, they appear to be instances of Aristotle employing tools of scientific reasoning in application to ethical enquiry. The stated aim of the volume is to explore the extent to which Aristotle actually does approach ethics with a scientific framework and "to expose some of the ways in which the received view has over-estimated the gap Aristotle sees between science and ethics" (4).

The thirteen essays are organized into three parts: (I) Ethical First Principles, (II) Enquiry and Explanation, and (III) Ethics and the Natural Sciences. The essays vary significantly in their support of the editors' aim of "bridging the gap" and in their conception of what would constitute a bridge. In the first chapter, for example, Nielsen attributes to Aristotle the view that ethics is an "applied science" that has two component parts: theoretical knowledge of moral principles and practical knowledge of how to apply those principles. Clearly, she is firmly committed to the existence of a bridging mechanism in Aristotle's thought: for her, the fundamental part of Aristotelian ethical theory claims to be based on a body of theoretical knowledge. But other contributors offer milder theses, mostly pointing to features of Aristotle's method in the Ethics and of his theory of practical wisdom that resemble features of his scientific theory. There is variation among the authors in how strongly they think these similarities indicate a merging of science and ethics in Aristotle's thought. At the extreme opposite to Nielsen, and coincidentally in the last chapter, Charlotte Witt expresses the greatest doubt about the existence of a bridge. She argues that the "instability of normative kinds" in Aristotle's ethical ontology renders ethical enquiry and ethical knowledge unscientific. I will briefly describe all of the chapters, but I will single out for criticism one from each part.

The four essays in Part I each consider the role and content of "first principles" in the ethical domain from different perspectives and with different conclusions. Nielsen argues in the first chapter that the aim of Aristotle's ethical treatises is to examine "the nature of happiness and its causes" and identify principles of right action (33). The definition of happiness and the moral principles themselves are invariable, according to her, which means that investigation and discovery of them is a scientific enterprise. It is only at the stage of application that we find inexactness in ethics because there is a great deal of variation when we "wish to spell out what a life well lived means in practice" for particular people in particular situations (44). The enquiry that constitutes the ethical treatises, she concludes, is the theoretical or scientific component of ethics, and the application of principles is the practical component, also described in those treatises.

Nielsen's argument is quite interesting as an interpretation of the precise status of the ethical treatises (e.g., the whole of the Nicomachean Ethics) in relation to practical wisdom itself (e.g. the focus of EN Book 6 alone). But when she isolates ethical philosophizing from practical activity and identifies the former as scientific, she seems to have neglected Aristotle's firm commitment to the separation of science and ethics in the very souls of people engaged in them. Nielsen would have us suppose that ethical knowledge straddles the divide between the theoretical part of reason (to epistemonikon) and the calculative part (to logistikon). This means, of course, that not all ethical knowledge belongs to the logistikon, and therefore practical wisdom -- which is a virtue of the logistikon -- is not the possession of the whole of ethical knowledge. Some form of ethical expertise must belong to the epistemonikon as well if Nielsen's account is correct.

However, Aristotle's discussion of practical wisdom tells against the possibility of any such ethical expertise belonging to the epistemonikon. When comparing practical wisdom with philosophical wisdom (sophia) -- which happens to be a state of expertise of the epistemonikon, just like scientific knowledge -- he makes very clear that practical wisdom is the only state of ethical expertise.

Philosophical wisdom (sophia) will contemplate none of the things that will make a man happy, for it is not concerned with any coming into being, and though practical wisdom has this merit, for what purpose do we need it? Practical wisdom is the quality of mind concerned with things just and noble and good for human beings (EN 6.12 1143b19-21).

The clear implication is that no psychic state other than practical wisdom (the excellence of the logistikon) enables us to know about human goods. As it is, Nielsen's argument seems to have neglected this important aspect of the psychological theory in the Ethics.

In the second chapter, James V. Allen sheds light on parallel ways both of knowing and of having mere true opinion that appear to be operative in both the theoretical and the practical domains of knowledge for Aristotle. These similarities suggest a somewhat unified epistemology, and so Allen's work here is quite illuminating. David Charles and Mary Louise Gill, in their respective chapters, each suggest that there is an analogy between scientific knowledge and practical wisdom insofar as the former involves grasping some "first principles" as explanations for theorems and the latter involves grasping some starting point(s) which explain the choice-worthiness of actions and determine which action is a worthy goal. These two chapters, side by side in the volume, discuss entirely separate ethical starting points and never acknowledge the starting points discussed by the other.

Part II, "Enquiry and Explanation", contains four essays. The first three investigate the methods employed by Aristotle in the Ethics, each with a slightly different focus. Joseph Karbowski and Daniel Devereux both consider the ways in which Aristotle does or does not rely on endoxa in his ethical enquiry. Karbowski focuses on EN Book 1, arguing that Aristotle mentions widely held opinions there only to dismiss them and certainly not to rely on them as starting points. As such, the presence of endoxa in Book 1 does not indicate that Aristotle is employing a dialectical method. In chapter six, Devereux argues that Aristotle nowhere in his ethical theorizing relies on dialectic but instead employs the "method of endoxa," which has certain likenesses to the method Aristotle deems appropriate in empirical science. And Carlo Natali argues in chapter seven that Aristotle employs different methods at different stages in the multi-faceted discussion of EN Book 5 (the comprehensive discussion of justice). Most importantly, the method applied to the search for a definition of justice is a dialectical one of the sort found in the Analytics. Thus, Natali makes the case for thinking that Aristotle's ethical enquiry, at least in part of EN Book 5, depends on scientific methods.

Henry's chapter "Holding for the most part: the demonstrability of moral facts" is one of the volume's more interesting discussions . Henry carefully dissects and examines the various ways Aristotle relies on the concept of "holding for the most part" (hos epi to polu) in his discussions of natural science. Some propositions that "hold for the most part" capture causal relations while others capture mere correlations without causation, and those of the former type are eligible for featuring in scientific demonstrations while the latter are not. It is not sufficient, then, that a proposition "holds for the most part" for it to be ineligible for demonstration. Henry argues that ethical propositions that "hold for the most part" -- such as "wealth is beneficial" and "courageous actions are good" -- belong to the category of causally efficacious facts. After all, that "courageous actions are good," even if only in most but not all cases, explains why courageous actions are choice-worthy. Ultimately, Henry's aim is to show that Aristotle's judgement that ethics is indemonstrable must be on grounds other than that ethical generalizations hold for the most part.

Natural scientists, on Aristotle's conception, are in the business of isolating the natures or essences of natural entities as being the reasons why natural phenomena occur. Henry certainly highlights this feature when he identifies hos epi to polu facts about natures as being properly scientific propositions. It is unclear, though, that practically wise people are doing analogous work in the ethical domain. Aristotle is unequivocal in asserting that practical wisdom is knowledge about particular actions that arises from experience in performing particular actions. The generalizations that come to be reliable tools for the practically wise person in her deliberation -- generalizations such as "courageous actions are good" -- capture what is revealed through a rich history of experience. These generalizations do not reveal the nature or essence of actions, or in any case they appear not to be known by the practically wise person as such (EN 2.9 1109b21ff.). Accordingly, these propositions "hold for the most part" not due to imprecision in the nature or expression of nature but because they are rough syntheses of a mass of lived experience. That ethical propositions "hold for the most part" actually is what renders them ineligible for inclusion in demonstration, then, but only because they hold for the most part in a different way from natural scientific propositions. If this analysis goes any way toward reflecting Aristotle's conception of practical wisdom, then Henry's discussion has missed out on a very important metaphysical difference between science and ethics: the former is study of natures while the latter is not.

Part III, "Ethics and the Natural Sciences", includes five chapters. Both chapters nine and twelve, by James G. Lennox and Monte Ransome Johnson respectively, provide rich discussion of the natural scientific backing to Aristotle's discussions in the ethics. Lennox focuses on the biological grounding of the concept of natural virtue, and Johnson focuses on the points of contact between the Physics and the Ethics (mostly Eudemian). In the final chapter, Witt argues that it is perilous to model ethics as a science on the basis that craft can be modelled as a science. Craft is dissimilar to ethics insofar as craft knowledge consists, at least partly, in grasping the function of the craft's products (e.g. the function of a shoe), while there is no such function-bearing product in ethics. The ontology is different, and so the whole system of knowledge is different. Finally, Mariska Leunissen and Christopher Shields, (chapters 10 and 11, respectively) tackle the question of how much natural science we need to know before we can have practical wisdom. Leunissen argues that "the level of knowledge of natural scientific theories that is required for understanding of Aristotle's moral project is quite substantial and not rudimentary at all" (217). She points to Aristotle's reliance on biological concepts when he rolls out the "function argument" in EN 1.7 as evidence that students of his ethical lectures are expected to have a sophisticated understanding of biology. Still, she draws the line at expecting ethical or political experts to grasp scientific demonstrations.

Shields, however, argues that political wisdom, despite being a form of practical knowledge, depends upon and requires theoretical understanding of the soul. That is, Shields attributes to Aristotle the view that a politikos is someone whose practical knowledge is grounded in scientific demonstrations that fully explain why the final end for human beings (happiness) is what it is. The trouble with this account is that it neglects the epistemological framework set out by Aristotle in the Analytics, where he carves up domains of knowledge according to their separate theorems, first principles, and subject-matter (APo 1.7 and 1.10). When Shields argues that practically wise people ground their practical understanding in scientific demonstrations, we must wonder what set of first principles -- the practical ones or the scientific ones -- are properly upper-limits of explanation of ethical knowledge. Shields attempts to wave off concern by saying that psychological study need not be constitutive of ethical knowledge in any sense even if the latter depends on the former. But to the extent that Shields conceives of practical knowledge as incomplete or inadequately supported if it is not had together with scientific knowledge, he is suggesting that a politikos' wisdom consists in grasping psychological first principles as the ultimate reasons why. Practical wisdom cannot be cleaved apart from knowledge of psychology, then, because the two domains share a single set of first principles. This does great violence to Aristotle's conception of the differences between bodies of knowledge, effectively obscuring an important feature of his epistemology.

Overall, this volume offers an enlightening discussion of Aristotle's theory of ethical knowledge. Neglected corners are explored and a strong case is made for thinking that Aristotle's comments about the divisions between science and ethics were only the beginning of the conversation, not the end. However, as I have suggested, there is still a great deal more the volume could do to make good on its promise of "advancing our understanding of the epistemological, metaphysical, and psychological foundations of Aristotle's Ethics" (25).