British Ethical Theorists from Sidgwick to Ewing

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Thomas Hurka, British Ethical Theorists from Sidgwick to Ewing, Oxford University Press, 2014, 310pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199233625.

Reviewed by Jonathan Dancy, University of Texas at Austin/University of Reading


This is a remarkable book. Thomas Hurka offers us an extraordinarily rich account of the views of a century of British moral philosophers: Sidgwick, Rashdall, McTaggart, Joseph, Prichard, Russell, Moore, Carritt, Ross, Laird, Broad and Ewing. He recounts the debates they had with each other, and the changes of mind to be found in their writings, in great detail. And this is not just description, a list of things said, gainsaid and unsaid; he also offers characteristically forceful assessments of who was right and which changes of view were for the better and which for the worse, and in general tells us which side to be on. There are chapters on every aspect of the territory: moral concepts, metaphysics, epistemology, the battle between consequentialism and deontology, value and the good, moral and otherwise, and punishment. For those interested in the work done in this period, Hurka's book is a wonderful resource. The index alone is amazing. I have read most of the works he discusses but confess that I find it quite impossible to keep the details in mind and that it is hard for me to know where to locate the things I am looking for in what is a considerable corpus of work. I need no longer worry; much of that is done for me in the index (which is to Hurka's discussions, not to the primary material -- but one can get to the latter via the former). The work involved in putting all this together must have been staggering.

Hurka also does an excellent job in bringing out the commonality of approach shared by these thinkers. They were for the most part non-naturalist realists, with an intuitionist epistemology and a conception of basic moral truths (whether about duties or about values) as non-derivative. There was of course the great split between consequentialists and deontologists, with Sidgwick on one side and Ross and Prichard firmly on the other. But such disagreements were far less significant than their agreements.

Reading all this, I wondered which writer comes out best in the end, and I think the answer is that Ross is the one with whom Hurka most often sides when push comes to shove. And I would guess that Hurka disagrees with Broad's suggested title for Ross's second book: The Righter and the Better.

In what follows, I choose only two topics for detailed discussion, mainly because they are intrinsically interesting and I think I have something to say about them.

There is an intriguing discussion of fittingness on pages 76-77. Hurka starts by detailing Prichard's eventual rejection of the notion of duty simpliciter in favour of the notion of one action being more of a duty than another. This generates a scalar deontology, analogous to recent suggestions of a scalar consequentialism. Scalar deontologists talk only of degrees of deontological duty, never of such a thing as non-comparative duty (the absolute 'ought'). Hurka objects to such a view that it is unable decisively to recommend any course of action. 'But surely a moral view should be able to make the stronger recommendation, and that requires the non-comparative claim that the first act is simply right.' At this point it seemed to me that, just as Ross can make recommendations even in terms of his notion of prima facie duty, saying of some course of action that it is the most pressing of one's prima facie duties, so Prichard can recommend a course of action if that course is more of a duty than any other course. But there is a difference because to think of something as one's most pressing prima facie duty is not to think of it as a duty at all -- at least not yet. But to think of something as that which one most ought to do, in Prichard's sense, is to ascribe to it the greatest amount of genuine obligatoriness, So Prichard's notion is intrinsically deontic, whereas Ross's is only related indirectly to something genuinely deontic (duty proper).

There are, I suppose, two dimensions to keep in mind here. We want to be able to single out one course of action from all the others. Any superlative, whether Ross's or Prichard's, is perfectly capable of doing that. We might however also want something more peremptory than a mere superlative can provide -- as might be found in the remark that you ought to do what you most ought to do, which apparently moves from one to the other. But I don't really see why the deontic style of 'most ought', understood in Prichard's way, should reduce it to some sort of non-decisive recommendation as opposed to a decisive one, or a requirement.

There is an oddity here which needs to be sorted out. Hurka writes, 'If all we can say is that one act is more obligatory than another, we have not decisively recommended the first act over the second; each remains morally permitted.' We might doubt this on the grounds that we ought not to act in one way when we are more obliged to act in another. But that would be a confusion because it uses the absolute notion of 'ought' which we have explicitly abjured. Matters are not improved by our adding that we are not permitted to act in one way when we are more obliged to act in another. For this uses an absolute notion of permission; a gradualist would simply say that we are less permitted to act in that way. Still, I would say that the notion of permission does not lend itself to gradualism. It is not that, of every action that we have some duty to do, we also have some permission to do it. There is only one action that we have a permission to do, and that is the one that is our duty proper (Ross), or what we most ought to do (Prichard).

Be that as it may, Hurka proceeds to argue that, if we do have a non-comparative deontic concept, in addition to any comparative one, the question is which, if either, is to be taken as primary. His own suggestion is that we should take the non-comparative one as primary, as Ross does in The Right and the Good, understanding both prima facie duty and duty all things considered in terms of duty proper; and Hurka offers two reasons for that choice, of which I found the first very interesting. This concerns a special version of the alternative view, found in Ross's Foundations of Ethics, which understands prima facie duty in terms of fittingness. Such an account, Hurka says, must be informative; there must be more to a claim of fittingness than the claim that other things equal one ought to act accordingly (the latter being the prima facie claim, distinct from the claim that one ought all things considered to act in this way). Fittingness, he says

has some distinctive content, suggesting a kind of complementarity whereby one thing matches another or fills a normative gap the other created, and this complementarity is present in some prima facie duties. Fulfilling a promise fits the fact that you made it, by satisfying a specific demand the promise created.

I really liked this insistence that there be some pointed sense in the notion of fittingness; and Hurka goes on to put that insistence to use: 'But it is harder to see independent content in the claim that an act fits the fact that in your situation it will produce the most good. Here there seems to be no distinctive complementarity, or nothing beyond the fact that you ought other things equal to maximize value.' The suggestion here is that there is nothing for the action to fit except the fact that it will produce most good and that this is not enough. But I would have thought that the friends of fittingness could say that the act fits the situation (either as a whole or, as in the present case, in a respect), not the fact that it will produce most good. The situation (or some aspect of it, such as the distribution of goods in the different possible responses to it) generates a demand for this act, as fitting to it. This might come about when what one is doing is meeting a need. That it will produce most good is not what the act is intended to fit but is rather the respect in which it is fitting, or the way in which it gets to be most fitting. Other fittingnesses will also be grounded in the nature of the situation, with an attendant explanation of the respect in which that groundedness is generated.

Hurka's conclusion is that

If the prima facie duty to promote the good does not involve any complementarity, there must be a generic 'ought' present in it and all other prima facie duties. Some duties, for example about promise-keeping and gratitude, do involve fittingness, but only because they involve a prima facie 'ought' with the right basis. But fittingness does not explain the prima facie 'ought'; it presupposes it.

I am suggesting that this conclusion has not yet been made out.

Hurka suggests that in addition to prima facie duties, a full Rossian system needs a dose of prima facie permissions (180-1). The main purpose of this addition, first mooted in a paper jointly authored with Esther Shubert,[1] is to enable Ross to cope with supererogation. The concept of the supererogatory has, as they put it there, two sides. On the one hand, a supererogatory act is not required; on the other, it is somehow better than any alternative. The question is how this is possible. And the key is that if we are not required to do it, we are permitted not to do it.

So the way in which Hurka and Shubert propose to make room for the notion of the supererogatory within a broadly Rossian system is to add a conception of prima facie permission to that of prima facie duty. The idea is that even though an action may be a PF-duty, we may have a PF-permission not to do it, and this PF-permission may defeat the PF-duty in very much the same sort of way as one duty can defeat another, with the result that no duty proper results even if we have no contrary PF-duty to defeat the one already on the table.

This is an intriguing idea, but I doubt that it makes eventual sense. In its terms, our first thought is that any action that involves a cost to ourselves is one that we have a PF-permission not to do. The question whether we are all things considered permitted not to do it is apparently decided by whether the relevant permission is stronger than any PF-duty we might have to do the action. Now thinking in terms of PF-duty, one action can be more of a duty than another, more stringent or pressing as a duty. The notion of 'more of a duty' involves a comparison between two non-comparative scores: the weightiness of one duty against that of the other. But it is not clear to me that there is such a non-comparative score associated with the notion of a permission.

The permissions we are thinking about are all permissions not to act in a certain way; any permission I have to walk away is derived from a permission not to get involved. If it were not, then as far as I can see every sort of action would be PF-permitted, and the only question would be which of those PF-permitted actions are also wrong. But things are not like that. Rather, an action is a PF-duty because of some feature that it has, one that counts as a reason to do it (putting the matter in non-Rossian terms). A permission arises, however, when despite having such a (prospectively) duty-making feature, the action has some other feature that prevents the duty-making feature from doing its duty-making thing. It only makes sense to talk of a permission not to act if that permission defuses a reason-giving (or PF-duty-making) feature. In this regard permissions are not on all fours with PF-duties. Permissions of this sort are always negative and secondary: they are permissions not to act despite the presence of a duty.

An action can get to be permitted in more than one way. It can be that we have no PF-duty not to do it; it can be that our PF-duty not to do it is equaled by a PF-duty to do it, in which case we can presumably choose; or it can be that we have a PF-duty not to do it, and no contrary duties, but something prevents the PF-duty from generating the duty proper that we would ordinarily expect it to generate if present alone. But I think there is also the possibility that the cost to the agent prevents the relevant considerations from generating even a PF-duty. A permission not to act would, on that picture, undermine not only any duty proper to act but also any PF-duty to act. And I think this is what we find: it is not as if I have some duty to act but this duty is not strong enough to defeat a permission not to act. Because of the cost to me, there is for me no call to act of the duty-making sort. I can do it, and it would be very good of me to do it, and good if I did do it, but I have no duty to do it.

There is another question whether permissions are themselves matters of degree. Can I be more permitted to do this than I am to do that? I don't think this question makes any sense. What does make sense is that circumstances that would render one action impermissible may not do that to another action. So Hurka and Shubert say that 'If the permission to do X outweighs some duties that the permission to do Y does not but the opposite never occurs, the permission to do X is stronger.' (7) But a permission does not outweigh a duty; it undercuts it. Only a duty can outweigh a duty; or, to put it another way, permissions cannot do to duties what other duties can do.

My general conclusion here is that the terminology of the prima facie does not suit the way in which permissions work.

These matters of disagreement are completely inconsequential, however, when put against the very considerable respect I have for Hurka's achievement in this book.

[1 'Permissions to Do Less Than the Best: A Moving Band', in Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics 2 (2012): pp. 1-27.