British Idealism and the Concept of the Self

Placeholder book cover

W.J. Mander and Stamatoula Panagakou (eds.), British Idealism and the Concept of the Self, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 335pp., $109.00, ISBN 9781137466709.

Reviewed by Andrew Vincent, Cardiff University


Despite a long history of theoretical inquiry, going back to the Socratic advice to 'know thyself', the 'self' remains a controversial topic on which there is little or no settled consensus in philosophy. As the editors of this volume remark, the idea of the self remains one of the perennial 'puzzles of contemporary philosophy', being both deeply familiar and at the same time remaining 'mysterious' (p.1). Many would now argue that the self cannot, in fact, be captured in one discipline (such as philosophy) and requires a much broader disciplinary canvas. This would be particularly true in some of the formulations of the 'narrative self'. Another group, immersed in aspects of neuropsychology or neuroscience, argue that the self needs to be viewed within a much tighter, more precise scientific frame. In this latter setting, the self appears (or does not appear), in the context of neurons, physical brains and of course the fMRI scanner (as one of the serious tools for understanding brains). This latter tendency has come to overshadow large areas of debate in the philosophy of mind and neuroscience. One upshot of this debate is that many now believe that 'nobody ever was or had a self'.[1] The self is just a figurative or fictional idea. This latter position, particularly within neuroscience, has, if anything, gained in prestige over the last few decades. The self, in this context, is thus just a feature of a certain kind of brain-based neuronal information processing system, not unlike a computational algorithmic structure. This might be called loosely a 'minimal self' explanation.

Some have undoubtedly seen various self-models at work here, although these are not selves in any classical 'substance' sense. They rather refer to complex physical brain states, possibly even locatable (via, for example, fMRI) in specific physical regions of the brain. At the most affable end of this debate, as one of the philosophers in this field, Patricia Churchland, has put it, 'The brain makes us think that we have a self'.[2] However, the reality of the self, in this context, is as real as any other production of the physical brain. Within philosophy - outside the more immediate domain of the philosophy of neuroscience - the self has also frequently been viewed as a myth. Hume famously doubted its existence, and his scepticism has been followed by many others. A more recent philosopher, Anthony Kenny, sums up this sceptical demeanour, regarding the concept of the self as simply a 'grammatical error', a piece of 'philosopher's nonsense consisting in a misunderstanding of the reflexive pronoun'.[3]

At the end of the nineteenth century, in his Principles of Psychology, William James categorized a number of diverse working senses of the self. Subsequent philosophers (and psychologists) have expanded and developed these. There are indubitably some who do take the idea of the self seriously (without immediately reducing it to interacting neurons), yet the majority will still identify many different competing versions of the self. Thus, James' inventory of physical self, mental self, spiritual self, and the ego have been noticeably amplified and extended to the present day. Such a wide divergence of views, and suspicion of the self as a topic of serious inquiry, is rendered additionally more complicated by the fact that this present volume not only focuses on the problematic nature of the self, but investigates it within one particular philosophical movement -- the British Idealists. For many contemporary philosophers, this would simply augment their initial scepticism. The British Idealist movement is in a strangely awkward position here. This is partly due to the fact that much of the (Anglo) philosophical literature on the philosophy of mind and the self over the last fifty years has arisen largely in the context of what might loosely be called the analytic movement, which developed initially and self-consciously in the early 1900s against the negative backdrop of British Idealism. In fact, from the writings of Bertrand Russell and G.E. Moore onwards, the analytic movement largely rejected British Idealism wholesale, in some cases even denying its philosophical status altogether, the only short-lived and sporadic exceptions to this philosophical pogrom being F.H. Bradley and R.G. Collingwood. In this scenario, it is peculiarly refreshing to have a thoughtful reminder of the different, but nonetheless sophisticated, philosophical treatments of the self within the British Idealist movement.

It would admittedly have been edifying to have had a more direct critical comparison of themes within the Idealist movement and more contemporary interpretations of the self, but that would have demanded a very different kind of volume. The main methodological theme underpinning the present text is a historico-philosophical unpacking of various Idealist accounts of the self, approximately in the period between the 1850s and 1930s. Unusually, and informatively, in this context, it begins with an essay examining the work of James Ferrier, John Grote and J.H. Stirling and closes -- chronologically -- with two essays on Collingwood and a final, more speculative philosophical essay on the self from the recently deceased Leslie Armour (to whom the volume is dedicated). The more conventional essays in the volume cover the writings of T.H. Green, F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, Edward Caird and J.M.E. McTaggart.

There is one initial caveat to make here. There is no single idealist understanding of the self. Whether you are addressing, more broadly, the work of Kant, Fichte, Hegel, Bosanquet, Bradley, Caird or Green, all have subtly, or occasionally decidedly, different understandings of the self. Further, an important contextual distinction within British Idealism is that between Absolute and Personal Idealists. William Sweet's and Avital Simhony's essays in this volume touch upon the distinction. One can see, for example, the philosophical disparities between these two elements in stark critical profile in a significant debate within the Aristotelian Society, in 1918, over the question 'Do Finite Individuals Possess a Substantive or Adjectival Mode of Being?'. By and large, the focus of the majority of essays in the present volume are chiefly on idiosyncratic variants of Absolute Idealism, although, as indicated even here, there are some significant internal variations and complexities. For example, it does not seem plausible, without some significant qualifications, to merge T.H. Green's work unproblematically with Absolute Idealism. Yet exactly how one characterizes Green's philosophy still remains an open question. There are aspects of his work which clearly indicate an affinity with forms of Absolute Idealism, yet at other points his work seems much closer to a variant of neo-Kantianism. Green's late interest in the work of Herman Lotze is an example of this latter shift.

The first paper, by Jenny Keefe, examines the work of Ferrier, Grote and Stirling. Ferrier is probably the most significant and influential of these, in particular due to his Institutes of Metaphysic (1854). A robust idealist theme arises in his work in terms of the core importance of the 'cognising self' to all experience. The conscious self (which in Ferrier is identical with self-consciousness) constitutes experience. Further, consciousness is not an aspect of the self; to all intents and purposes it is the self. It is its core defining feature. In consequence, for Ferrier, there can be no Enlightenment-based 'science of man'. The self and object are one and the same. We thus only know ourselves as subjects of awareness. This theme, in one philosophical shape of another, punctuates much Idealist work in this period.

The papers by Dina Babushkina and James W. Allard take Bradley as their central theme. Babushkina concentrates largely on Bradley's Ethical Studies, arguing that, despite multiple articulations of the self within the latter work, Bradley's conception of the self is nonetheless viewed as a unitary process of moral development, which she entitles a 'project' of lifelong endeavour. Bradley's varying expressions of the self are thus framed within this systematic project. Allard discusses the Bradleian self in a more intricate metaphysical and religious framework. He compares various potentially contradictory senses of the self (and God) in both Appearance and Reality and Ethical Studies.

Bradley, like Bosanquet, was often criticized for his account of the finite self as both contradictory and lacking in reality. As William Sweet notes in his essay, it became a common criticism of Absolute Idealism, especially in the metaphysical context, that it did not fully recognise the reality, distinctness and value of individual selves. This critical issue is also constructively addressed in Simhony's paper on Bosanquet, particularly in response to criticisms by the Personal Idealist Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison. Phillip Ferreira's essay on Edward Caird examines the complex dialectic between the self, not-self (the external object world) and God, developed within his religious and social philosophy. Caird's philosophical preoccupations were much more explicitly Hegelian in texture in comparison to fellow British Idealists. He thus described himself as an 'unregenerate Hegelian'. The final dialectical resolution of the self for Caird echoes Hegel's Science of Logic, where the highest 'absolute idea' is seen as 'self-consciousness', which unites the self and the objective world and provides the ground for both practical and theoretical activity.

Janusz Grygieńć' scrutinizes the relation between self-realisation and the common good in Green's social and political thought. He reads this relation as a potentially paradoxical contrast between individualism and holism, both elements arguably present in Green's work. He identifies six possible resolutions to this paradox, arguing in the final analysis for three of these, and ultimately leading to what he entitles a 'liberal-socialist' resolution. Rex Martin addresses an analogous dilemma for Green's self -- in this case, reconciling notions of Green's eternal consciousness with that of the individual self. For Martin, ethical self-realisation is largely seen in the context of social recognition, involving an extended relational understanding of the self which, in turn, embodies strong metaphysical, ethical and social dimensions. Martin, in the final analysis, links this understanding of the self with Green's notion of rights, which he sees as a 'middle ground between the extreme individualism, on the one hand, and the celebration, on the other, of community as an overarching value' (p.144). This dialectic of individualism and collectivism, holism and self-realization, sociality and unique selfhood, the common good and individual good, appears again in the essay by Panagakou on Bernard Bosanquet - where the best life is seen as one of human fellowship and self-realisation within the context of institutions seen as ethical ideas. The dialectic also appears in Simhony's essay, where the self is understood as predominantly 'relational'. The self is understood in this latter context as subsisting relationally within multiple social systems and groups, thus drawing out very different human capacities. Sweet's essay has parallel concerns, but in this case, he responds to Bosanquet's critics on finite selfhood, showing, in effect, how Bosanquet reconciles the moral and metaphysical understandings of the self. In this context, the Absolute is not seen as a negation of the individual (as argued by Personal Idealists amongst others), but is rather the high-water mark (quoting Bosanquet) 'of an effort in which our minds actually consist and have their being' (p.189).

Gary Cesarz's paper on McTaggart engages unexpectedly with some more contemporary philosophical work on the self. The gist of his argument is embedded in an opening comment: 'how ironic that neuroscience and philosophy of mind today seems hell bent on explaining away that which it engages in explaining' (p.263). He contrasts McTaggart's arguments with Humean, materialist and dualist theories of the self, and more specifically focuses on the work of the Churchlands and Daniel Dennett. He sees McTaggart developing a viable and defensible account of the self which is compatible with both epistemological realism and ontological idealism. His overarching argument (for which he finds systematic support in McTaggart) is that 'we cannot be rid of the self; for as long as we go about explaining, we affirm the self. Even if we press a clever self-deception, we will not have lost the self -- we will only have hidden it again from ourselves' (p.278).

The papers by Ian Winchester and James Connelly take Collingwood as their central theme. Winchester investigates Collingwood's conception of the person or self in terms of the latter's much larger inquiry into human civilization in The New Leviathan (1942). The person or self is an agent characterized by reason and free will, both of which are mediated through sophisticated language abilities. This self, in turn, embodies for Collingwood the modern European understanding of the person, which also underpins our ideas of civility and civilization. Connelly's paper is premised on his own current scholarly preoccupations in writing a biography of Collingwood. Given that Collingwood has sophisticated reflections on both the concept of the self and that of biography, a range of tangled questions arise in writing a biography of the philosopher himself. For Collingwood, the self is a fluid project, embedded in a continuous dialectic with society and there is no point at which a self is or could be ever complete. The self is identified most significantly with diverse 'projects' and 'self-understandings'. For Connelly, therefore, to 'try to write a philosophical biography is to take on the burden of positing a self and a character to an agent whose thought is (mostly) their life . . . a self is constituted by its projects' (p.260)

The final two papers are by W.J. Mander and Leslie Armour. Mander's essay on 'Idealism and the True Self' notes the suspicions of modern philosophy regarding the concept of the self, but argues that the idea of the self or true self is central to British Idealist thought and constitutes a core component of their overall philosophical vision. He analyses four ways of explicating the self in British Idealist thought which he sees as underpinning their arguments: the moral ideal, the concept of obligation, the idea of freedom and the concept of teleology. Armour's is a more speculative essay, noting that the concept of the self tends to continuously outrun all our categories. Thus, persons may be said to have rationality, bodies, language, consciousness, character and so forth, but do any of these encompass or fully account for the self? Can one, for example, be unconscious and still a self? For Armour, selfhood and personhood are most likely present 'if I can successfully utter the claim to be one' (p.314). However, such an uttering is a symptom, not a cause, of selfhood. We transcend all categorizations, particularly through creativity and a capacity to generate meaning and value (although we also perform this creative task within a community of selves, whilst retaining a tense awareness of our own unique selfhood).

What features stand out in the idealist account of the self? The most apparent characteristic, particularly in relation to much contemporary philosophy, is the sheer breadth and ambition of the idealist account, which is hard to condense into a small compass. As the editors note, the idealist notion of the self provides a window into a wide array of issues. The idealist self is thus intimately connected to the concepts of consciousness, self-consciousness, self-knowledge and self-realization. Significantly, it also has profound links with the philosophy of mind and epistemology. Realizing the self is achieved via the evolution or development of the self-conscious mind and its diverse projects. The notion of reality and cognitive experience are also closely interconnected in this scenario. The self is seen to arise within a unity of experience, which is envisaged as a complex, internally differentiated whole. As J.H. Muirhead commented, the self 'has been constructed out of a reality and by a reality, which is not less than it'.[4] For many critics, this kind of argumentation can collapse potentially into a denial of the reality of the finite self, an argument most memorably associated with Bradley's Appearance and Reality.

In addition, there is a characteristic philosophical resistance to all forms of naturalism, psychologism, materialism and realism. Selfhood per se is attained not by maintaining an impervious shell of privacy or independence, but rather by opening to a broad array of influences. The broader the influences and concerns, the more capacious the self. This argument gave rise in some idealist writings (notoriously, for some critics) to broader and shallower senses of the self. Importantly (in this broadening context), the self is viewed as intrinsically and deeply social. The sociality of the self is integral to elaborate accounts of ethics and political philosophy (probably one of the most well-known dimensions of British Idealism). Underpinning all of these issues lay a pervasive and ambitious series of metaphysical reflections which formed a crucial, if contentious, backdrop to all the debates on the self. In some cases, the metaphysical arguments embodied explicit implications for the philosophy of religion and indeed, in some cases, aesthetics.

Overall, this is an invigorating and valuable collection of papers, and the editors are to be complemented for their hard work in bringing it together from the initial conference. It will be a useful addition to a small but growing body of literature from a stalwart group of scholars, working in diverse ways on British Idealist philosophy. In another sense, it also whets the intellectual appetite; one quickly realises that it is still only an intriguing snapshot of a much richer and more multifaceted body of ideas within British Idealism. Nonetheless, the present volume provides a beneficial and fruitful pathway into this literature and is to be welcomed.

[1] T. Metzinger, Being No One (MIT Press, 2003), p.1

[2] P.S. Churchland, Brain-wise: Studies in Neurophilosophy (MIT Press, 2002), p.124.

[3] Anthony Kenny, The Self (Marquette University Press, 1988), p.4.

[4] J.H. Muirhead, The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy (Allen and Unwin 1965), p.422