British Philosophy in the Seventeenth Century

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Sarah Hutton, British Philosophy in the Seventeenth Century, Oxford University Press, 2015, 286pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199586110.

Reviewed by Benjamin Hill, The University of Western Ontario


This book is the latest instalment in The Oxford History of Philosophy series. The series is supposed to weave together a new history of philosophy based on contextualist treatments of the ideas, arguments, and figures animating a specific place and time. At first hearing, it sounds exciting. Contextualist techniques and approaches have become prominent over the past twenty years. They have proved quite fruitful and illuminating and have opened important new pathways across well-trod texts and figures. Indeed, much of the progress recently made in understanding the development of philosophy is due to the adoption of contextualist techniques and approaches. However, a common criticism of contextualist history of philosophy is that it makes the history of philosophy out to be nothing but one damn thing after another: philosophical content often gets buried among a wealth of historical minutia and detail, so much so that the content gets lost and the relevance of the contextualist material is hard to see. The promise, then, of being shown how our understandings of the arc of the history of philosophy has changed thanks to the rise of contextualist history of philosophy is exciting.

This volume in particular occupies a crucial spot within the series. The seventeenth century marks a watershed in philosophy's evolution. It was also the era of the scientific revolution, a period when the rise of the mechanical philosophy and the emergence of science from natural philosophy fundamentally altered metaphysics and epistemology. Furthermore, much of contemporary philosophy traces its concerns and foci directly back to the seventeenth century. And the British branch of the period was especially important, according to most historical narratives. Descartes is reputed to be the father of modern philosophy, but Hobbes and Locke are equally implicated in its origins and early development. And most philosophers in the Anglo-American tradition today trace their heritage back to Hobbes, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Changes, therefore, in our understanding of seventeenth century British philosophy are potentially far-reaching and consequential.

Sarah Hutton is an excellent choice for author. She is an eminent senior scholar with an extensive publication record. Although most famous for work on the Cambridge Platonists and women philosophers of the seventeenth century, she has also done considerable work in Locke, Newtonianism, and seventeenth century Platonism generally. Moreover, she is a leader in the contextualist movement and has done much to illuminate the intellectual culture of seventeenth century British philosophy.

Hutton wisely decided to use the idea of a philosophical conversation to approach philosophy in this time and place. The idea is to present the various figures as engaged with one another in an on-going discussion of thoughts and ideas. A benefit is that this preserves the dominance of certain voices in the conversation (Bacon, Hobbes, More and Cudworth, and Locke) while including many others who are often overlooked (Herbert of Cherbury, Margaret Cavendish, and John Norris). Everyone contributes to the conversation even though some talk more and exert greater influence over the direction of the conversation. Another benefit is that it lets us see the continuities among the thinkers and helps us to view philosophy as it was, without artificial gaps or "revolutionary" breaks.

Although not formally divided, the book has two main parts. (There is also a useful biographical appendix.) The first part, chapters 1-4, provides context to the philosophical conversation. Chapter 1, "An Age of Transformation," documents some of the changes happening within the subdisciplines over the course of the century. It also provides a rudimentary overview of the political and social context. In Chapter 2, "Philosophy in the Universities," Hutton maintains that even though the practice of philosophy largely moved outside the walls of academia during the seventeenth century, academic practices and conceptions continued to shape and influence the extra-curricular philosophical activities. Chapter 2, thus, describes the university's conception of philosophy, how teaching philosophy changed over the course of the century, and how religion and politics affected the university system.

Chapter 3, "Cross-Currents, Conduits, and Conversations," describes the ways British philosophers engaged with other European philosophical conversations. Hutton identifies travel, correspondence, and books and translations as the primary conduits for contemporary continental ideas into the British conversation. She also presents the usual list of primary non-British interlocutors -- Platonism, Stoicism, Skepticism, Epicureanism, Gassendi, Grotius, Descartes, Malebranche, and Spinoza -- and identifies a few British followers of each. The final contextualist chapter is Chapter 4, "Aristotelianism and its Enemies." As you might imagine it documents the many critics of Aristotelianism in the seventeenth century and discusses the ways its defenders tried to preserve and re-entrench it. Of the four, this chapter is most clearly engaged with the standard historical narrative of heroic, modern philosophers inexorably driving a hidebound scholasticism into philosophy's rubbish heap. Hutton rightly emphasizes here the multifaceted characters of seventeenth century Aristotelianism and the viability it retained for many thoughtful people as a philosophical system. Kenelm Digby, John Sergeant, and William Ames are prominently featured as representatives of the diversity and power of seventeenth century British Aristotelianism.

The second part of the book, chapters 5-10, constitutes its true heart. This is where the narrative concerning philosophy's evolution is articulated. Hutton traces it roughly chronologically, from Bacon and Herbert of Cherbury to the freethinkers, idealists and woman philosophers of the 1690s through the 1710s. The inclusion of some thinkers and trends is not at all surprising -- Bacon, Hobbes, the Cambridge Platonists, the experimental philosophers and Newton, and Locke. But the identification of others as major figures (Cherbury and Richard Cumberland) and their groupings (Cherbury with Bacon and Cumberland with the Cambridge Platonists) are more so.

Today Cherbury is known only as the named target of Locke's critique of innate moral principles. Hutton's basis for including him, however, is his eighteenth century reputation as one of the pillars of the Enlightenment's anti-clericalism (92). Hutton stands him alongside Bacon because both sought new foundations for philosophical enquiry: Bacon's empiricism as a basis for natural philosophy and Cherbury's nativism as a basis for avoiding the skeptical crisis. These two features represent a tension within Cherbury's works and reputation. His early epistemological nativism seems to have had nothing to do with his later anti-clericalism. Hutton gives us little reason to think that Cherbury's nativism affected the British philosophical conversation about ethics or epistemology very much. The most she says about it is that being considered worthy of refutation by the greatest thinkers of the age (Gassendi, Descartes, and Locke) is itself indicative of its significance. Fair enough, I guess, and perhaps the distinction between minor and major figures is largely relative. But it provides us with little reason to think his nativism ought to factor in our narrative of seventeenth century philosophy. The anti-clerical De religione gentilium, on the other hand, ought to be part of the background to histories of eighteenth century deism in much the same way that Ramism is for seventeenth century logic. I happily concede that, but it seems to have little to do with much that was going on in the seventeenth century. As much as I enjoyed learning more about Cherbury and his thinking, the value of it for my historical studies and reflection are not altogether clear.

Cumberland and the Cambridge Platonists present a different worry. According to Hutton, they are grouped together because both were products of mid-century Cambridge and, more importantly, both are anti-voluntarists. It is not at all clear, however, that Cumberland's anti-voluntarism with respect to natural law and Cudworth's and More's rationalism in ethics and natural philosophy have the same roots, as Hutton suggests. Cumberland's continuities with Aquinas and Suárez, compared with More's and Cudworth's continuities with Lipsius, seem more indicative of dual, independent conduits toward similar positions. Cumberland is probably better placed within an intellectualist natural law tradition, as is usually the case, and Cudworth and More are probably better placed within a Stoic tradition of virtue and natural necessity. Hutton's attempt to push them together as critics of Hobbes and Epicureanism (156) seems forced and does not strike me as fruitful or illuminating.

There is little else in this volume to criticize or disagree with. I might find a few minor points of interpretation to dispute, but Hutton does a wonderful job presenting a large body of diverse and complicated material accurately and concisely. She is to be commended heartily.

Nevertheless, I could never shake the feeling that the history she is presenting is nothing but one damn thing after another. And this disappointed me greatly. The problem is a failure to connect most of the material together. This is especially noticeable between the contextualist chapters and the narrative chapters. For example, Hutton gives the "dissenting academies" their own subsection in Chapter 2. But neither they nor the philosopher and work identified as their most substantial philosophical contribution (Theophilus Gale and his Court of the Gentiles) are ever mentioned again in the body of the text. How they contributed to or connected with the other developments of philosophy in the seventeenth century is left unsaid. If they did not influence Locke, Cudworth, or Norris (for example) in any discernible way, it would be nice to at least be told how they helped to shape the climate necessary for Locke's, Cudworth's, or Norris's philosophical thinking. Did they or Gale's Platonism help to open people's minds to Norris's more Malebranchean version of Platonism, for example?

Another more significant example concerns the logical background. Logic and the logic curriculum were large and prominent components of the contextualist chapters, and rightly so. Yet the details documented there played no role in the discussions of the narrative chapters. But they might have. Do the commitments to precision and rigor expressed in the logical textbooks help to illuminate how Hobbes conceived of philosophical method and his definition-heavy methodology? Or, how might it be used to explain why many of Locke's contemporaries, and probably he himself (IV.xxi.2), considered the Essay a work of logic? And, more importantly, how might this affect our conceptions of his compositionalism and his method for acquiring knowledge. One of the benefits of contextualist analysis here, it seems to me, is to help us to see how Locke fit the "new way of ideas" into the structure of a traditional account of logic and what the significance of that is for understanding his larger aim and project.

Sometimes too the presence of "minor" figures cited and arising within the narrative chapters seem to be included solely for the sake of filling in gaps. They pop up, some discussion of them ensues, and they are gone again. What and how they are contributing to the larger narrative is unclear. Walter Charleton in Chapter 8 "From Philosophy to Science" might be an example of this. Certainly he is an important figure in mid-century British natural philosophy and should be included. But why he is important and how he contributed is not so clear. Readers are left to infer from the depiction of him as an Epicurean sympathetic to Gassendi, but really his contribution is more than just as a conduit for Gassendist and Epicurean ideas. Margaret Cavendish appears in the chapter on Hobbes. This is not inappropriate and she is introduced as a critic of Hobbes while being nonetheless a Hobbesian broadly speaking. What is not clear is how what she is doing is extending Hobbesianism or moving the conversation in a different direction or something altogether different. If the theme is supposed to be extending Hobbesianism, why not Samuel Parker, who does not seem to be mentioned at all in the volume? If the theme is Hobbes' Stoic materialism, then Cavendish fits perfectly. But what is the narrative thread of this new history of philosophy supposed to be here? Sticking with the conversation analogy, what we seem to have in the narrative sections is more like a transcription with little to no commentary. This has a place, of course, but this series does not seem to be it.

Perhaps indicative of this is the polyphonous character of the conversation described in the final chapter, "Freethinkers, Idealists, and Women Philosophers: Philosophy from 1690 to 1710 -- and after." It is a hodge-podge, throwing together John Toland and Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, Mary Astell and Catherine Trotter, and Samuel Clarke and John Norris. There does not seem to be much holding them all together except that they were flourishing during the final years of the Stuart era. In itself, there is nothing wrong with that, but the new historical narrative should say something about how such a polyphonous conversation arises out of the discussions of the previous ninety years, and why this kind of polphonousness is materially and philosophically different from the diversity that always arises among a large and disparate group of interlocutors.

On reflection, this seems to me to be tragic rather than something criticisable. And tragic not only in the sense that it perpetrates a common criticism of contextualist history of philosophy. It is tragic also because it results from the very character of the series, which is the very thing that first excited me about the series and volume. Contextualist history of philosophy cannot be sweeping, narrative history of philosophy. Done properly and well, contextualist history of philosophy uses fine detail and historical minutia to push against certain interpretations and, ultimately, certain narrative themes. But it is like moving a large ship: a few nudges here and there can be absorbed or require only minor corrections to the ship's course; but a substantial number of them, well-placed, coordinated, and sustained, can push the whole ship onto a new course. The work of Daniel Garber and Roger Ariew regarding Descartes and the mathematization of philosophy is an excellent example of how contextualist analysis of the fine detail pushes against a huge historical narrative.

At best, then, contextualism could lead to a revised narrative and be the scholarship that supports such a revised narrative. But it cannot find a place within the narrative without either abandoning its contextualist focus, abandoning the goal of a narrative sweep, or both. Or so it seems to me. A better approach, then, might be to simply write an alternative historical narrative, one that the recent contextualist scholarship is pushing us towards. In this regard, one could do worse than to focus on the development of Platonic or Stoic themes in natural and moral philosophy, variously conceived, against the Aristotelian hegemony and a Lockean reaction to it that triggered a new, vigorous debate in the 1690s through 1710s. And no doubt someone could do even better. But as a contextualist historian of seventeenth century British philosophy myself, I would liked to have learned more about what contextualist history of philosophy can teach us about the sweep and development of philosophy during the period and at the place as a whole.