Brute Rationality: Normativity and Human Action

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Joshua Gert, Brute Rationality: Normativity and Human Action, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 244pp, $75 (hbk), ISBN 0521833183.

Reviewed by Christian Miller, Wake Forest University


This is the first book by Joshua Gert, son of the well-known moral philosopher Bernard Gert. Among other things, Gert argues for a novel account of both objective and subjective rationality, a new theory of normative reasons, and a distinctive approach to construing the relationship between reasons for action and rationality. The result is an impressive book filled with interesting arguments and objections, which should advance philosophical discussions on a number of important issues.

I will briefly summarize each of the nine chapters in Gert's book before turning to some critical remarks.

Chapter Summary

Gert begins by informing the reader that his book should be read as "part of the tradition that seeks to discover and defend a fundamental normative principle applicable to action" (4). Such a principle is meant to be fundamental, not in the sense of being the most important or efficacious in adjudicating normative disputes, but rather in the sense of explaining what is for an action to count as rational (4-5). Such a theoretical standing for the principle implies that there will be no normative standpoint from which the principle itself can be rationally criticized. The remainder of the first chapter is then devoted to outlining various desiderata that any account of such a fundamental principle should meet.

Accepting the now familiar distinction between normative and explanatory reasons, Gert devotes chapter two to criticizing the view that "sufficient justifying [normative] reasons will eventually yield requirement. This is the essential point that this book challenges in the practical realm. That is, no matter how strong the justification for some action becomes, it never follows, simply in virtue of the strength of such a justification, that one is required to do the action" (20-21, emphasis his). In place of the view that normative practical reasons only play the role of determining rational requirements on action, Gert argues instead that there are two distinct roles for such reasons: the justifying role, in which otherwise irrational actions can be rendered rationally permissible, and the requiring role, in which otherwise irrational actions can be rendered rationally required (23, 56). In this chapter, Gert's main aim is to motivate this distinction by using several thought experiments and an argument from analogy. The thought experiments involve altruistic actions which would bring about a greater good but which would also involve personal sacrifices and/or a non-trivial risk of injury. The implication is meant to be that in cases like these, there may be very strong normative reasons which rationally justify acting altruistically, but they do not rationally require such actions (22-23, 26). The argument from analogy makes use of the role that some considerations can play in morally justifying an action without morally requiring it (28-36).

Any view which countenances justifying reasons might be in trouble given the widespread acceptance of practical reasons internalism, according to which practical reasons must motivate rational agents who are aware of them. After all, many justifying reasons only secure rational permissibility, and so an agent would not be irrational if she were to not be motivated by these practical reasons in certain cases. But, Gert argues in chapter three, reasons internalism depends on accepting the following:

(1) The requirement view: All practical reasons are prima facie rational requirements. That is, if one acts against such a reason, then one is either acting irrationally, or one is acting on other countervailing practical reasons of at least equivalent strength (43).

Using an argumentative strategy familiar from Korsgaard's work, Gert then argues that until the requirement view has been established, we are not forced to be reasons internalists, and furthermore that the requirement view itself looks to be false in a number of cases involving altruistic actions (43, 54).

In chapter four, Gert provides a functional role analysis of normative reasons, or more specifically of what he calls 'basic' normative reasons, or those normative reasons which do not need any other considerations standing behind them. Here is a simplified version of the analysis:

(2) In the sense of 'rational' that has to do with objective rationality, a consideration is a basic reason if and only if it plays at least one of the functional roles (i) or (ii), and has constant strengths, and is comparable to all other reasons, within and across roles:

(i) making it rationally permissible to do actions that would, without it, be irrational, or

(ii) making it rationally required to do actions that would, without it, be rationally permissible to omit.

If a reason can fulfill role (i), then it is said to have justifying strength. If a reason can fulfill role (ii), then it is said to have requiring strength.[1]

One distinctive feature of this approach is that it analyses reasons in terms of rational status, which Gert alleges is the direct opposite of what most approaches do in the literature (63).

Gert next argues against the view that normative reasons have one strength value that is used in determining the rational status of actions. More specifically, he rejects the following:

(3) If there is a conflict between the only two reasons relevant to a choice, and one reason is stronger than the other, then one is required, on pain of irrationality, to perform the action favored by the stronger reason (86).

Instead there are justifying and requiring strengths for reasons, and thus it is possible for the strongest reasons to not rationally require action.

In chapter six, Gert turns his attention to ideal motive accounts of normative reasons, which all have the following general form:

(4) p is a reason for S to do A if, and only if, were S to consider p in the right way he would be given some motivation to do A (113).

Gert argues that typically such accounts implausibly assume that there is a unique degree of motivation that would be had by any idealized agent. On the contrary, there is a range of acceptable motivation, one end of which corresponds to requiring strength and the other to justifying strength (114).

Chapter seven is the heart of Gert's book, since it is here that he presents, explicates, and defends his accounts of both objective rationality and subjective rationality. Here is the former:

(5) An action is objectively irrational iff virtually everyone would regard the action as irrational, if they were fully informed about all nontrivial consequences of the action (140).

Gert claims that (5) is extensionally equivalent as a matter of objective fact to:

(6) An action is objectively irrational iff it involves a nontrivial risk, to the agent, of nontrivial pain, disability, loss of pleasure, or loss of freedom, or premature death without a sufficient chance that someone (not necessarily the agent) will avoid one of these same consequences, or will get pleasure, ability, or freedom, to a compensating degree (141).

Presumably, then, (5) is meant to be the official statement of the fundamental normative principle mentioned above, whereas (6) attempts to substantively characterize the actions which would be regarded as irrational by virtually everyone given full information.[2]

Turning next to subjective rationality, here is Gert's official view:

(7) An action is subjectively irrational iff it proceeds from a state of the agent that (a) normally puts an agent at increased risk of performing objectively irrational actions, and (b) has its adverse effect by influencing the formation of intentions in the light of sensory evidence and beliefs (160).

We shall return to both (5) and (7) in more detail below.

The final two chapters apply the previous results to contemporary debates about reasons internalism and the structure of practical reasoning. In the first, Gert returns to the topic of chapter three and argues that a version of reasons internalism is in fact true about requiring reasons but that we should be externalists about justifying reasons. Finally, chapter nine is largely devoted to a critical discussion of the view attributed to Dancy, Quinn, Raz, and Scanlon that rational action requires the formation of normative judgments.

Some Remarks

In the remaining space, I will make a few brief stylistic comments before saying something more substantive about Gert's treatment of objective rationality, subjective rationality, and normative judgments.

Gert's writing is typically clear and rigorous, and for a slender volume his book is full of careful arguments. My main reservation in this area is that most of the chapters are reprinted (and to some extent revised) versions of published papers, and so the chapter transitions are at times a bit disjointed and the material repetitive in places. For example, both chapters three and eight concern reasons internalism, but it wasn't clear why they needed to be separate chapters or appear at opposite ends of the volume. Furthermore, I would have benefited in several places from more methodological discussion which illustrated what contribution the previous material was supposed to be making to the larger concerns of the monograph. To take a case in point, after a long and detailed discussion of the role of normative judgments in practical reasoning, Gert abruptly ends the book without standing back and, for example, (i) reminding the reader of the importance of this discussion to the general aims of the work, or (ii) summarizing what he takes the main contributions of his book to be.

Let us return to Gert's response-dependent view of objective rationality:

(5) An action is objectively irrational iff virtually everyone would regard the action as irrational, if they were fully informed about all nontrivial consequences of the action (140).

What does full information amount to? As far as I can tell, Gert says nothing about full information when explicating his view, which is especially surprising given the different criteria one finds in well-known discussions by Williams, Brandt, Lewis, Smith, and others. Similarly, it would have been very helpful to find at least some discussion here of the conditional fallacy.

What about regarding an action as irrational? Here Gert says this:

(8) A person regards an action as irrational iff that person cannot see, and does not believe that there are, any consequences of the action that could allow someone sincerely to advise someone else to do it (140).

But (8) seems to be far too permissive; in my own case, it would follow that I regard every action as not irrational since I can always see consequences of an action that could allow someone to sincerely advise another to perform it. This includes consequences such as causing immense suffering or bringing about mass genocide, so long as the advisor is suffering from mental illness or has a sufficiently depraved moral character. Nor would we want to use some independent normative criterion to delimit only some select group of advisors or to restrict what consequences can be "allowed" since (8) is meant to be used in an account of the fundamental normative principle.[3]

If this is right, then given (5) together with the assumption that virtually everyone else would in a similar fashion believe that someone could play the role of such an advisor for any action, it follows that no action is objectively irrational. Similarly, (5) won't be extensionally equivalent to (6) Ð we can think of people for whom the consequences of pain or loss without any positive effects would still allow them to sincerely advise others to perform the acts in question.[4]

Let us turn to the account of subjective rationality:

(7) An action is subjectively irrational iff it proceeds from a state of the agent that (a) normally puts an agent at increased risk of performing objectively irrational actions, and (b) has its adverse effect by influencing the formation of intentions in the light of sensory evidence and beliefs (160).

Against sufficiency, suppose that the state is a desire about which (a) and (b) are true but which is such that I fully identify with it and regard it as fundamental to my most basic self-conception. Then it seems strange to label the resultant action as subjectively irrational since by my own lights there is no more basic subjective standpoint at that point in time from which it can be criticized.

Similarly and against necessity, if I do not identify with a desire but am thoroughly alienated from it, then actions which are caused by such a state could be subjectively irrational by my own lights even if the desire itself does not satisfy (a).

What this suggests in general is that subjective practical rationality is broadly a matter of the agent's actions being responsive to the practical reasons that the agent has by his or her own lights.[5] Against this, Gert objects with cases like the following:

For example, suppose that I believe that I can fly, and therefore that I will not fall to my death when I jump off of the roof of my apartment building. Despite the fact that I do not believe I will be harmed by jumping, it is still subjectively irrational to jump. Why? Because I should believe that I will be harmed (154, emphasis his).

But I would have thought that the 'should' here is clearly expressing a purported requirement of objective rationality, not subjective rationality.

Finally, let me end with a brief thought about normative judgments. On Gert's view and simplifying greatly, objective practical reasons can serve as the non-normative objects of desires, and these desires in turn can produce intentional and rational actions when they are causally efficacious in the right way (193, 195). Central to his view is the negative claim that the normative judgment that some action is good or desirable rarely plays a role in the production of intentional behavior.

As a claim about the behavior exhibited by non-reflective wantons (in Frankfurt's sense of the term), Gert's causal story is familiar and plausible. But as a story about the actions produced by reflective agents, it seems to me at least to be insufficient. While space constraints prohibit an adequate discussion, one point worth noting is that since the propositional content that we read off from the desires in Gert's story is purely descriptive content like that I become a professional philosopher or that I vote in the election, it is hard to see how the agent could take such alleged reasons to have any justificatory force when giving a rationalizing explanation for her action to either herself or others. That I become a professional philosopher doesn't seem like it could be an adequate reason by the agent's own lights for applying to philosophy graduate school, whereas the content of a normative judgment like that it is a very good thing for me to become a professional philosopher, does.[6]


The above critical remarks are not intended to be decisive in any way, but merely to serve as an invitation for Gert to clarify and elaborate his views in greater detail. Nor do they detract from my very strong recommendation of this book to anyone who works on issues pertaining to rationality, practical reasoning, or reasons for action.

[1] 79-80, emphasis his. Gert notes that this simpler version in fact might be equivalent to the one he actually gives on page 80.

[2] I say 'presumably' because when he introduces (5), Gert surprisingly does not describe it as the 'fundamental normative principle' that, he claimed, was the central aim of the book to discover. Nor does he explicitly evoke the desiderata from chapter one and systematically test his positive proposal against each of them in turn to see how it fares.

Note that (6) is supposed to allow that many morally required actions need not be not rationally required, and similarly that many morally forbidden actions are not rationally forbidden. The first is intended to be an advantage that Gert's view of objective rationality has over the views employed by contractualist and consequentialist moral theories, whereas the second avoids an allegedly implausible consequence of Kantian moral theories. For discussion, see pages 11-16, 82-84, and 142-145.

[3] As far as (8) is concerned, I also would have benefited from some discussion of what 'cannot see' adds to the analysis that is not already captured by 'does not believe that there are.' Note that on one reading, (8) again ends up being incredibly strong Ð regardless of what the agent believes at the moment, he will not regard an action as irrational if he is such that he could see any consequences of the action that could allow someone sincerely to advise someone else to do it.

[4] It might seem as if what is driving this line of criticism is an overly simplistic and uncharitable interpretation of (8). In my defense, let me briefly make two points:

(a) Gert explicitly notes that he intends the first 'someone' to be literally anyone: "The real question of relevance is whether anyone could sincerely offer considerations in support of the claim that the agent should perform a particular action. Whether the person is a friend or not is really neither here nor there" (138).

(b) Similarly, Gert later on uses Peter Singer as an example of 'someone' whose recommendations might not be shared by the person in question in (8), but which are such that they nonetheless can preclude an action from being regarded as irrational: "For the question of relevance is: could someone concerned for the agent sincerely recommend to him that he allow his own family to suffer for the sake of nameless strangers? And the answer is 'Yes.' Peter Singer, for example, has recommended exactly this" (144).

Finally and in spite of the above, one might think that (8) should be read as something like the following:

(8*) A person P regards an action as irrational iff P cannot see, and does not believe that there are, any consequences of the action that could rationally permit someone sincerely to advise someone else to do it, according to the standards of rational permission held by P.

There would be concerns about the informativeness of (8*) since we would then need an account of what it is to regard an action as rationally permitted. Furthermore, it seems hard to reconcile (8*) with the passages quoted in (a) and (b); after all, many peoples' rational norms may not permit the recommendations made by Peter Singer or by someone with a severe mental illness.

[5] For helpful discussion, see Allan Gibbard, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1990. 18-22, Richard Joyce, The Myth of Morality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001, 53-55, and David Sobel, "Subjective Accounts of Reasons for Action." Ethics 111 (2001): 461-492.

[6] I take up this issue at greater length in my Agency and Moral Realism, Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Notre Dame.