Buddhist Ethics: A Philosophical Exploration

Buddhist Ethics

Jay L. Garfield, Buddhist Ethics: A Philosophical Exploration, Oxford University Press, 2022, 231pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190907648.

Reviewed by Richard P. Hayes, The University of New Mexico


This book is a contribution to the series “Buddhist Philosophy for Philosophers,” which so far also has a monograph on Buddhist epistemology and one on Buddhist metaphysics. As with the other books in the series, Jay Garfield’s book is written primarily for philosophers who are open to exploring Buddhist approaches to ethics rather than for philologists or historians of Buddhist thought, although scholars in Buddhist studies also stand to benefit from reflecting on Garfield’s presentation.

As the author makes clear from the outset, Buddhists have not until recently written much that could be considered metaethical in nature. Ethicists accustomed to detailed discussions of metaethics might therefore be inclined at first to conclude that the Buddhist tradition has little of interest to say to them. One of Garfield’s tasks, therefore, is to look at the presuppositions behind the discussions of proper conduct and good character that are found in abundance in the Buddhist literature that has emerged during the past two and a half millennia. As the author acknowledges, it is impossible to do justice to the vast literature of Buddhism in a single volume, but this monograph is an excellent place to begin exploring the Indian and Tibetan Buddhist traditions; aside from some references to Thich Nhat Hanh, very little is said about the numerous East Asian traditions of Buddhism.

Garfield presents Buddhist ethics as a kind of what he calls moral phenomenology that is casuistic, particularistic, and agent-relative in nature, and which operates within a naturalistic, as opposed to a supernaturalistic, framework. Each of these aspects of the presentation will be discussed more fully in what follows.

In presenting Buddhist ethics as “moral phenomenology,” Garfield explains that he is not using the term as various moral psychologists have used it, but rather in a specific sense “denoting an approach to ethics in which the goal is the cultivation of a distinct way of experiencing oneself and others in the world, or a mode of comportment toward the world” (21, n.6). This, he claims, differentiates Buddhist ethics from most of Western ethical discourse in that the focus for Buddhists is not on what one does but on “what and how we experience, and how we respond to that experience affectively” (29). Buddhist ethics, then, is discussed within the framework of the central Buddhist problematic, namely, the recognition of the universality of suffering, the causes and conditions that give rise to suffering, and the task of eliminating the effect by eliminating its causes and conditions. This problematic is mostly psychological in nature, in that the principal focus is on the internal factors responsible for the subjective experience of unsatisfactoriness rather than on the external circumstances that are experienced as unsatisfactory. The key to the task of eliminating the experience of suffering is to transition away from a self-centered perspective to a nonegocentric perspective by realizing that everything, including oneself, is undergoing change within a vast network of causes and conditions and that there is no good reason to privilege one’s own experience over that of others.

Garfield makes a good case that Buddhist ethics is naturalistic in nature. As he explains it,

The guiding intuition is that we are organisms inhabiting a natural world, and what is good for us should be a function of the kind of organism we are, the kinds of societies we inhabit, and the world those societies inhabit, that there is no transcendent domain that could be the source of ethical good. By naturalism, then, I mean the commitment to a theory that can be embedded in an informative supervenience model, in an account of constitution, or of causal explanation within the general physicalist framework of the natural sciences. (170)

The principal metaphysical commitment of Buddhist thought is that everything without exception is caused by antecedent and contemporaneous conditions, and that if one were to abstract from any existent thing all the conditions that makes it what it is, there would be nothing left over. In other words, any given thing is nothing more nor less than the totality of its causes and conditions. Among the many implications of this claim is that nothing is autonomous, from which it follows that there is no autonomous self that can be seen as the agent of thoughts, words, and bodily deeds. Any Western ethical theory that presupposes an autonomous agent freely willing to act is therefore distinct from Buddhist ethical theory. One kind of putatively supernatural entity that is absent from Buddhist thought, therefore, is a durable self.

Although Garfield does not dwell on the inherent atheology of Buddhist thought, another supernatural entity that is absent from Buddhist ethical discourse is anything that answers to Western theologians’ depictions of God as a creator, a source of moral injunctions or prohibitions, and a judge of how well creatures have followed those moral guidelines. What Buddhist thought has instead is the doctrine of karma, which is simply an observation that certain ways of thinking and the actions that flow therefrom result in uncomfortable experiences while other ways of thinking and acting result in comfortable experiences.

For the vast majority of Indian and Tibetan Buddhists—arguably less so with East Asian, and especially Japanese, Buddhists—the doctrine of karma is inextricable from the doctrine of rebirth, and surely rebirth can be seen as a departure from the naturalistic commitment that Garfield claims underlies Buddhist ethics. Fully aware that he is at odds with most of the Indian and Tibetan Buddhist tradition, Garfield offers extensive arguments for two points, namely, that nothing in the doctrine of karma depends on the doctrine of rebirth, and that departures from Buddhist tradition are not necessarily departures from bedrock Buddhist commitments.

To summarize the first of these points, Garfield claims that the doctrine of karma rests “only on the conviction that there was a past, that the present is its consequence, and that the future is the consequence of the present” (175). All of this is consistent with the bedrock Buddhist commitment to the claim that there is no such thing as a self. Indeed, the popular notion of rebirth as a kind of transmigration of a self from one physical body’s lifetime to another makes no real sense in a universe devoid of selves. What does make sense is that the plurality of conditions upon which the notion of a person is supervenient gives rise to a plurality of effects. To put all this into the customary language of persons, just as countless persons from the past went into the making of who I am at this moment, how I act now will lead to the joys and sorrows of not just one but countless persons in the future. While Garfield’s way of looking at karma sans rebirth probably makes sense to most modern thinkers, it does raise hackles among those who hew to more traditional Buddhist ideologies.

The second point mentioned above is that departures from Buddhist tradition are not necessarily departures from bedrock Buddhist commitments. This point is made not only in the discussion of karma not being necessarily tied to rebirth, but also in a chapter on what Thich Nhat Hanh and others have called engaged Buddhism. On p.192 Garfield acknowledges that the dominant ideal in classical Buddhism was renouncing the world and that the principal focus was on individual psychopathology rather than collective problems of social structures. Several key Buddhist authors in the 20th and 21st centuries, however, “take structural and social problems as their targets, and insist that ethical cultivation involves responsiveness to them.” That this emphasis on social structures is relatively modern does not, argues Garfield, make it any less authentically Buddhist. As he points out,

Buddhists were in dialogue with non-Buddhist interlocutors from the time of the Buddha until the present. Buddhism influenced, and was influenced by, other philosophical and religious systems in countless ways, and that pattern of mutual influence continues today. Engaged Buddhism, with its inflection by modern European thought and its attention to contemporary social science and social structures, is an important instance of that fecund interaction, and deserves attention as an instance of that long-standing pattern of development. (197)

This observation exemplifies one of the principal strengths of Garfield’s discussions of Buddhist ethics, namely, that he deals with Buddhism as a living tradition worthy of consideration but also liable to undergo further change in the light of the consideration that it is given. Much, but by no means all, of the attention to social issues in the writings of modern Buddhists has been done by Westerners whose thinking has been influenced by Jewish and Christian reflections on social responsibility and by secular psychologists and sociologists; that Buddhist thinkers have responded to these influences only makes them like all Buddhist thinkers before them whose understanding of Buddhism was influenced by Brahmanism, Jainism, Confucianism, Daoism, or Shintō.


To return now to the claim that Buddhist ethics is naturalistic in Garfield’s sense of that term, one of the implications of placing ethics within the context of causality is that this placement challenges the notion of free will that is often seen as indispensable to moral responsibility. Garfield takes this topic on in the fourth chapter, entitled “Agency and Moral Psychology.” First, Garfield points out that Buddhists’ concern with freedom has not been with the freedom to do what one wants or freedom from causes and conditions but rather with freedom from eliminable forms of suffering by working within the framework of everything being the result of causes and conditions. He the points out that

Freedom in this sense is compatible with determinism, but not in the sense intended by contemporary compatibilists: there is no agent causation in the picture. And there is no will in the picture. Indeed, given the absence of the theodicy problem in Buddhism, there was no need to invent a faculty of will, and there is no word in any Buddhist canonical language that can translate will as it has come to be used in Western philosophical and legal discourse. The Buddhist approach to ethics rejects this entire image of an autonomous self independently giving rise through mysterious free agent causation to actions; instead, ethical thought proceeds on the assumption that our actions are just as much cause as anything else, and that we are just as much a part of the natural world as anything else. (50)

It was said at the outset that Garfield presents Buddhist ethics as casuistic, particularistic, and agent-relative in nature. Rather than being a set of general principles from which guidelines on how to behave are derived, Buddhist discussions of conduct tend to be given in the form of narratives that offer a multitude of examples of positive and negative behavior upon which one reflects and, through that reflection, modifies one’s view of the world. This is an accurate characterization of how nearly all Buddhist discourse proceeds. Although Garfield does not mention the Zen Buddhist use of the kōan, that practice exemplifies the casuistic approach of most Buddhist teaching. A kōan is like a legal precedent in that it is a narrative of someone behaving in a particular way in a situation; it is then the task of the student to reflect on that behavior, to assess how the circumstances of that behavior is similar to present circumstances and to arrive through that reflection at a modification of the stated behavior that is suitable to the circumstances at hand. Among the features of the circumstances at hand that a Buddhist takes into consideration is the kind of vows the Buddhist has undertaken. Not everyone has made the same degree of progress along the path to more salutary ways of seeing, and not everyone has made the same level of commitment to amelioration, and therefore what is appropriate and possible for one person may not be appropriate or possible for another. In that sense, Buddhist ethics are agent-relative in nature.

It was noted above that this book has little to say about East Asian traditions of Buddhism. There is one Japanese Buddhist in particular that it would have been interesting to see discussed, namely, Shinran (1173–1263). Shinran spent much of his life doing practices of the kinds discussed throughout this book, only to observe that he was making no progress at all toward the goal of disencumbering himself of delusions and egocentricity. His efforts to make progress along the path was undermined by what Greek philosophers would call akrasia. Shinran concluded that this condition was not unique to him but was found in all human beings, and that this is because the goal of being nonegocentric is itself the ego’s project. Indeed, all goals are egocentric in nature. Therefore, the only path to liberation is one of realizing one’s own feebleness and accepting liberation through something very much like grace from Amitābha Buddha (Amida-butsu), who in Shinran’s view is far more supernatural than naturalistic. It would be interesting to see how Garfield would respond to this direct challenge to the common Buddhist notion that one can assess one’s mentality, see its shortcomings, and then undergo exercises to ameliorate it.

In an overall summary of the potential value to philosophers in general of studying a Buddhist approach to ethics, Garfield says this:

Although Buddhist ethical thought may profitably be seen as a supplement to much Western ethical thought, we should also note that taking Buddhist ethics seriously involves calling into question some commitments that might seem unquestionable, as they are so much a part of the fabric of contemporary Western ideology. We may not be selves. We may not be autonomous. We may not be free. Egoistic self-concern may not even be even prima facie rational. The distinction between the self-regarding and the other-regarding may be illusory. What counts as morally important may not be universal. And how we see and feel may be at least as important in the end as what we do. (200)

Taken as a whole, Garfield’s book offers an admirably lucid account of how one might understand some of the traditional Buddhist discussions of healthy-minded behavior. Some of what he says would no doubt seem foreign to the medieval Buddhist authors that many historians of Buddhist thought dedicate their time to reading and translating, but he is not writing for them. He is writing for those of us living in these times who are open to a different perspective than we may have encountered through exposure to predominately Western culture. His book is thought-provoking, witty, and a delight to read