Buddhist Philosophy of Language in India: Jñānaśrīmitra on Exclusion

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Lawrence J. McCrea and Parimal G. Patil (eds., trs.), Buddhist Philosophy of Language in India: Jñānaśrīmitra on Exclusion, Columbia University Press, 2010, 204pp., $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231150958.

Reviewed by Jonardon Ganeri, University of Sussex


McCrea and Patil's book, Buddhist Philosophy of Language in India: Jñānaśrīmitra on Exclusion, is primarily a translation of a treatise by the late Indian Buddhist philosopher Jñānaśrīmitra (975-1025). It includes an emended edition of the Sanskrit text and a very clear and readable introduction to key elements of the Buddhist epistemology and ontology which form the background to Jñānaśrīmitra's text. The book is valuable in the picture it gives of the state of Buddhist canonical debate in the eleventh century. More than that, it is a fine example of good practice in the preparation of translations from philosophical Sanskrit into English.

Just what is the Buddhist theory of "exclusion" (apoha)? It is a familiar enough point that some groups and associations are defined more by who they exclude than by who they allow in. The actual membership of such groups can be extremely heterogeneous, the only common factor among them being their mutual satisfaction of a negative rule of admission. So, for example, a club might insist that entrants do not wear jeans, and there may be little else that the costumes of the clubbers within have in common. We might even introduce a term for their costume, say "smart", where the expression "smart" is stipulated to mean nothing more than that someone is smart just in case they are not wearing jeans.

Classical Buddhist philosophy of language in India begins with this common-place and claims that it can be used as the basis for a general theory of meaning, a theory applicable not just to one special class of expression within the language but to every expression. The explicit hope is to provide an account of linguistic use which is compatible with a prior Buddhist rejection of any ontological commitment to the existence of natural kinds or any other sort of real property or universal. This is the so-called "exclusion" theory of meaning.

There is an obvious and apparently devastating objection to the generalization: if the account is applied to every expression, then it must apply to "jeans" as well as to "smart", and we seem to end up with the following pair of claims:

1) "Smart" applies to x iff x is not wearing jeans

2) "Wearing jeans" applies to x iff x is not smart.

It therefore looks at first as if the generalization reduces the theory to circularity; and this indeed was the objection voiced most strongly by Indian critics at the time. From a modern perspective, however, the objection seems misguided, since what the pair of claims reduce to is:

3) "Smart" applies to x iff x is smart,

a typical clause in a Tarskian truth-theory. So one might construe the Buddhist position as being that a theory of meaning which takes the form of the provision of a Tarksian truth-theory does not have any ontological commitment to universals. Whether or not that is ultimately a defensible claim, it is not obviously a circular one.

The Indian Buddhists who tried to address the circularity objection did not have this recourse available to them. Instead they tried a different maneuver. The alternative strategy was to search for some surrogate "positive" ingredient in the meaning of an expression, an element not reducible to a purely negative rule. The claim is that this positive ingredient is a mental image. That new suggestion, however, aside from inviting a variety of objections of its own, left the status of the exclusion theory hanging in the air.

It is here that the eleventh-century Buddhist philosopher Jñānaśrīmitra makes an interesting contribution. The book by McCrea and Patil comprises a fifty-page long translation of Jñānaśrīmitra's text, the Monograph on Exclusion or Apoha-Prakaraṇam, along with a forty page Introduction, an edition of the Sanskrit, and notes. The Introduction sketches the philosophical and textual tradition of thought to which Jñānaśrīmitra's work belongs. The key figures in this Buddhist tradition are Dignāga, Dharmakīrti and Dharmottara.

McCrea and Patil describe Jñānaśrīmitra's contribution as a "reworking" of the theory of exclusion. What precisely did the reworking involve? Remarkably, what soon becomes apparent in their study is that the reworking is nothing less than a radical shift in the conceptual status of the theory itself. Jñānaśrīmitra is explicit that, as far as he is concerned, language does not express anything at all and neither the exclusion theory nor the mental image theory is, strictly and literally, true. Instead, his claim is that both these theories are therapeutic or protreptic aids, to be believed provisionally in the course of engaging with the world or of freeing oneself from delusions of one sort or another about language. So the text begins: "Exclusion is what is revealed by words and inferential reasons. This position is established in order to demonstrate that all properties are inexpressible." And it ends:

If the question is 'What is it that is expressed by words?' then, having set out these options (1) on the basis of appearance, (2) on the basis of determination, or (3) really, the answers are, in order, (1) 'the image that is excluded from what is other, that resides in conceptual awareness'; (2) 'the particular that is excluded from what is other'; or (3) 'nothing.' This has already been said. Therefore, establishing the position that words and inferential reasons have exclusions as their objects is for the sake of making it known that all properties are inexpressible; this is the summation of the meaning of the first verse. (pp. 96-7)

McCrea and Patil focus on explaining some of the technical apparatus exploited by Jñānaśrīmitra, including the notions of "determination" and "conditionally adopted position" that are in play. Their analysis of Jñānaśrīmitra's argumentation and overall stance is relatively concise:

Despite his ultimate view that nothing at all is expressed, Jñānaśrīmitra still provides a "conditionally adopted position" of his own in order to explain how it is that we are able, even in the absence of any real object, to engage in pragmatically successful linguistic (and also inferential and conceptual) activity. Jñānaśrīmitra maintains, conventionally, that the content of our verbal (and also inferential and conceptual) awareness must be taken to be a complex object consisting of both a positive and a negative element. In accordance with our everyday linguistic experiences, a positive object must be taken to be what is primarily expressed by language. But an additional negative element, exclusion, must be taken to be a qualifier of that positive object. While we can act only towards positive entities, it is only through exclusion that we can pick out the appropriate objects for that activity by distinguishing them from those that are inappropriate. (p. 28)

The theory of apoha is now, in the terminology of McCrea and Patil, a "white lie." This turn of events is certainly surprising, and it raises many interesting and important issues about the role of language in human cognition which might fruitfully have been explored in greater detail in the book (an obvious comparison is with the concluding statements of Wittgenstein's Tractatus). Indeed, the fact that this is Jñānaśrīmitra's position leaves room for further elucidation of substantive aspects of the apoha theory of language, and interested readers might want to combine their reading of Jñānaśrīmitra's text with the philosophically exemplary analysis of the apoha theory in the work of Bimal Krishna Matilal (especially in Matilal 1971, 1982, 1986). A collection of pathbreaking analytical essays in Chakrabarti, Siderits and Tillemans, eds. (2011), the results of a colloquium held in 2005 and with a contribution by one of the authors of the book under review, also does much to clarify further the philosophical content of the Buddhist theory.

To conclude my review, let me say that this collaborative work is an excellent example of translation from philosophical Sanskrit, while also revealing the extraordinary degree to which later Buddhist philosophers in India are willing to revise the conceptual standing of orthodox Buddhist theory. The Monograph on Exclusion, as the authors state,

provides a coherent, but critical, account of intra-Buddhist debates on the nature and function of exclusion. More than an abstract discussion of the theory, the Monograph offers an intellectual history of Buddhist and non-Buddhist discourse on exclusion and conceptuality. (p. 2)


Chakrabarti, Arindam, Siderits, Mark, and Tillemans, Tom eds. (2011). Buddhist Semantics and Human Cognition (New York: Columbia University Press).

Matilal, B. K. (1971). Epistemology, Logic and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis (Mouton: The Hague).

Matilal, B. K. (1982). Logical and Ethical Issues in Religious Belief (Calcutta: Calcutta University Press).

Matilal, B. K. (1986). "Buddhist Logic and Epistemology," in B. K. Matilal and R. D. Evans eds., Buddhist Logic and Epistemology: Studies in the Buddhist Analysis of Inference and Language (Dordrecht: Reidel), pp. 1-30.