Buddhist Spiritual Practices: Thinking with Pierre Hadot on Buddhism, Philosophy, and the Path

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David V. Fiordalis (ed.), Buddhist Spiritual Practices: Thinking with Pierre Hadot on Buddhism, Philosophy, and the Path, Mangalam, 2018, 328pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780898001174.

Reviewed by Christopher W. Gowans, Fordham University


Pierre Hadot's interpretation of ancient Greek and Roman philosophy in terms of "philosophy as a way of life" constituted by "spiritual exercises" has received considerable attention from scholars of the period as well as by persons who welcome his defense of a way of doing philosophy that is more practical than dominant academic approaches today. Though Hadot is not without his critics (for example, questions have been raised about the adequacy of his historical claims),[1] his approach also has been seen as a point of view for interpreting non-Western philosophies. This has been true especially of Buddhist philosophy. The present collection of essays, based on a 2015 conference, is a welcome addition to the increasing number of readings of Buddhist philosophy from the perspective of Hadot. I will briefly summarize the essays and then offer some suggestions in light of them on some ways in which Hadot may be beneficial for our understanding Buddhist philosophy.

In his Introduction, the editor David V. Fiordalis argues that Hadot's framework for interpreting Greco-Roman philosophy provides a valuable model for interpreting Buddhist philosophy that, by emphasizing practical context, is superior to interpretations from the standpoint of analytic philosophy. The "unifying framework" of the volume, he says, is "spiritual exercises" rather than "problems and arguments" (p. 9). The seven essays focus only on classical Indian and Tibetan Buddhist traditions. There is no consideration of East Asian forms of Buddhism. The authors see value in Hadot's work, but they do not accept it uncritically. There are several arguments that it is limited or requires rejection or revision in some respect. There is also some discussion of Michel Foucault, whose accounts of "the care of self" were influenced by Hadot, but I will comment on this only in the first essay, where it plays a significant role. At the end of the book, there are select bibliographies of works by and about Hadot and Foucault, Buddhist works cited and other works referred to in the text.

The opening essay by the late Steven Collins discusses several issues including the value of comparative analyses of Greco-Roman philosophy and Buddhist philosophy, practices of self in both Hadot and Foucault (with a response to Hadot's critiques of Foucault) and the possibility of pursuing Hadot's philosophy as a way of life in the modern world. On the last point, he sees little prospect for Thoreau-like withdrawal, but thinks it may be possible in universities as well as Buddhist monasteries or meditation centers (rather different institutions).

Sara L. McClintock begins with Hadot's observation that philosophy as a way of life takes place in a school. She analyzes how this might apply to Indian and Tibetan Buddhist philosophical traditions by helpfully distinguishing three senses of 'school' that might be meant: an actual institution, a broad community of practice, and what she calls "doxographical hypostatizations of discursive practices" (p. 77), meaning philosophical positions such as Madhyamaka identified for purposes of analysis and debate. Though she sees this as complicating Hadot's account, she argues that Buddhist philosophers were engaged in a way of life seeking transformation and as such were committed to schools in some sense (however, she thinks this is true of philosophers generally).

Atiśa, a key figure in re-introducing Buddhism to Tibet in the 11th century, is the focus of James B. Apple's discussion. He interprets Atiśa's Special Instructions on the Middle Way (Madhyamakopadeśa) in terms of Hadot's concept of spiritual exercises intended to effect self-transformation. Apple argues that Atiśa employed reasoning (yukti) as a weapon for dissolving conceptual thought as a preparation for "non-conceptual" wisdom, an awareness that does not apprehend any things and thus eliminates attachment. Hence, reasoning is an important spiritual exercise, but it is transcended by awareness.

Pierre-Julien Harter argues that understanding Buddhist practices requires a more nuanced account than Hadot's broad concept of spiritual exercises. He distinguishes preparation-exercises (development of skills) and application-exercises (implementation of dispositions), and he distinguishes both from an immediate insight into reality that constitutes a transformation from one level of practice to another. Harter also argues that a better framework for understanding a variety of Buddhist texts is provided by the Buddhist term path (mārga). While some path texts are manuals of practice, instructions in how to achieve awakening, others are theoretical accounts of the nature of the path, as in the Ornament of Realizations (Abhisamayālaṃkāra) examined here.

Maria Heim draws on Hadot's emphasis on the dialogical style and "incomplete" state of ancient Greco-Roman philosophical texts to analyze two forms of text in the Pāli canon and their interpretation by the Pāli commentators Buddhaghosa and Dhammapāla. The sutta texts consist of dialogues and so are a figurative, contextual, qualified and relative form of discourse. By contrast, the abhidhamma texts present systematic, analytical accounts of experience and so are a definitive, literal, abstract and categorical kind of discourse. Yet both were interpreted as expressions of the Buddha's omniscience, though in limited contexts that render them open to modification.

The meditations on death in Greco-Roman and Buddhist philosophy are the theme of Davey K. Tomlinson's essay. He argues that these meditations have a rather different character when rebirth is assumed than when it is not (it is standardly assumed in Buddhism, but usually is not in the Greco-Roman philosophies, except for figures such as Pythagoras). In all contexts, reflections on our mortality can draw attention to the transience of human life and change how we live in the present. But when rebirth is assumed, meditation on death can involve preparation for the transition from one life to another that may be supposed to provide a special opportunity for enlightenment, by recalling our true luminous nature, as it is in the Buddhist text known as The Tibetan Book of the Dead featured here.

Finally, Fiordalis interprets Vasubandhu's Treasury of Abhidharma in terms of Hadot's account of the Stoic understanding of the role of philosophical discourse in philosophy. He emphasizes the place of reason in Vasubandhu's philosophy. The goal is "pure wisdom (amalā prajñā)," meaning the discernment of the basic features of reality, a form of "non-conceptual" or "non-discursive" awareness. But this is achieved through moral restraint and the three practices of study, reasoning and cultivation. There is a movement from a preliminary intellectual, theoretical reflection to meditative, experiential cultivation. Hence, reasoning is important but not sufficient for pure wisdom.

These essays admirably show how some themes in Hadot can illuminate Buddhist philosophy in a variety of ways. But there are several central topics that could be better addressed or answered about what Buddhist philosophy might be in light of Hadot, how the Hellenistic philosophers at the center of Hadot's account might be relevant to this, and how the approaches of the Hellenistic philosophers resemble and differ from common Buddhist approaches.

Fiordalis, as well as Apple and Harter, see Hadot as valuable because he offers an alternative to what is described as the emphasis on "problems and arguments" favored by "analytic philosophers" who interpret Buddhist philosophy (see pp. 2 ff., 106 ff., 148 ff. and 245 ff.). The importance of Hadot, according to Fiordalis, is that he offers a different model of philosophy "as a practice and a discipline," specifically as a way of life constituted by "spiritual exercises" intended to transform us (p. 9). In my view, this contrast is not the most helpful way to formulate the value of Hadot or even the perspective of several of the essays. A central reason is that philosophy as a way of life might well consist, in part, of the analysis of problems and arguments. Moreover, I would submit, in both Hellenistic philosophy and Buddhist philosophy, this is precisely how philosophy as a way of life was often understood. Hadot himself emphasized the fact that, in ancient Greek and Roman philosophy, one of the central spiritual exercises was philosophical discourse as the rational analysis of arguments that justify the way of life.[2] His important contribution was to draw attention to the practical aim and context of this intellectual activity.

It is worth noting that other recent interpreters of the Greco-Roman philosophers, affiliated with analytic philosophy, have made similar points, stressing the importance of philosophical arguments as one form of therapeutic exercise among others aimed at improving our lives.[3] Moreover, as noted above, Apple and Fiordalis themselves stress the importance of reason in Atiśa and Vasubandhu respectively.[4] As presented here, the dichotomy between philosophy as a way of life, on the one hand, and an emphasis on problems and arguments by analytic philosophy, on the other hand, does not aid our understanding of Greco-Roman or Buddhist philosophy. Hadot plays an important role in what is now a broad movement of thought, from several traditions and disciplinary perspectives, of interpreting many ancient philosophies in Greece and Rome, India and Tibet, and also China as practical self-cultivation philosophies. This movement should not be seen as diminishing the overall importance of rational arguments for these philosophies, but as urging that we assess these arguments in the context of their larger practical aim (including other spiritual or therapeutic exercises).[5] Though Fiordalis affirms the worth of such arguments, his brief for the value of Hadot tends to displace them from the main stage of Buddhist philosophy.

An important question raised by Hadot's analysis is what makes a way of life, a manière de vivre, or even a regime of self-transformation, philosophical as opposed to some other way of life or regime. For example, surely a way of life dedicated to moral improvement is not sufficient to render it philosophical. These essays sometimes touch on this topic, but they do not directly confront it as much as might be expected in a book presented as being a reassessment of the nature of Buddhist philosophy in light of Hadot. A brief version of the answer to this question, in my view, is that a philosophical way of life seeks a substantial improvement in our overall individual and/or collective well-being on the basis of a search for an understanding of fundamental issues about human life and the world we live in, employing for this purpose whatever cognitive capacities we human beings possess. In short, what makes a way of life philosophical is that it is committed to achieving a good life through the pursuit of wisdom (sophia in Greek and prajñā in Sanskrit). By this definition, much Buddhist thought and practice could be considered a philosophy as a way of life. In these essays, Collins (pp. 44-6) and Apple (p. 110) come closest to capturing this idea, but it would have been helpful to see more sustained reflection on the topic.

On my understanding of what makes a way of life philosophical, there appears to be at least one important difference between the Hellenistic and Buddhist approaches. In Indian and Tibetan Buddhism, it is common to suppose that, in addition to rational analysis, the meditative disciplines are crucial to attaining the transformative understanding, the practical wisdom, we need. This is articulated clearly in the essays by Apple and Fiordalis. They stress that for Atiśa and Vasubandhu respectively, rational analysis prepares the way for the "non-conceptual" or "non-discursive" awareness that is ultimately important. This awareness requires a form of meditation, a central spiritual exercise in Buddhism. But such meditative disciplines have no real counterpart in Hellenistic philosophy (if they are present at all, they play a much less significant role).[6] Moreover, their importance in Buddhist thought and practice is one reason why some Western philosophers, analytic and otherwise, are suspicious of the idea of Buddhist philosophy. But if these disciplines pertain to our capacities for understanding, if they are essential to the wisdom we need for a good life, then they might be part of a philosophical way of life as I have defined it. However, it is controversial, in the current state of Western philosophy, to suppose that such awareness could be a cognitive capacity relevant to philosophical understanding (since it is commonly claimed that reason is the only relevant cognitive capacity in philosophy). This issue is broached in these essays, but there is little direct analysis of whether this awareness properly belongs within philosophy. Of course, this point pushes in a different direction from my earlier claim about the importance of argument: for Buddhist thought and practice, both are commonly important.

Finally, an important feature of Hellenistic philosophy that is highlighted in Hadot's account is the analysis of the ways in which desires and emotions are often detrimental to our well-being and the defense of an ideal state of being in which we overcome these obstacles through philosophical understanding. This is an area in which there are substantial similarities with Buddhist philosophy. For example, the critiques of anger that are central to much Hellenistic philosophy, especially among the Stoics, have counterparts in a good deal of Buddhist thought. In some cases, the rationales are rather similar, and in other cases they are not. The similarities often have to do with overlapping assessments in moral psychology. The differences commonly depend on the sharp metaphysical divide between Buddhism and virtually all forms of Hellenistic philosophy. For both Buddhism and Hellenistic philosophy, the spiritual exercises often pertain to the transformation of desires and emotions. These exercises are at the heart of their ways of life, and analyses of them and their plausibility is central to thinking of these traditions as philosophical ways of life.[7] But there is not much of this kind of analysis in the essays in this volume. There is little examination of the reasons for central Buddhist ideas such as no-self, dependent origination and emptiness as well as the ways in which understanding these is thought to enable us to overcome anger and attain other purported practical benefits of Buddhist teaching.

One of the attractions of Hadot is that he encouraged us to think that philosophy as a way of life might again have a place in our lives, that we, living in the contemporary world, might find ways to develop our own philosophical ways of life, in part by drawing on the resources of the ancient Greco-Roman philosophies. If we take this seriously, then we will want to understand and assess the reasons that are put forward in favor of these lives. One value of the problems and arguments approach to philosophy is that it often does precisely this: it considers not only what the arguments of the ancients were, but whether we should accept these arguments or some reformulation of them. It asks, for example, whether Seneca or Tsongkhapa gave us plausible rationales for overcoming anger in the ways they recommend. This is another reason why we should resist Fiordalis' dichotomy between philosophy as a way of life and the problems and arguments approach. Nonetheless, the essays do explore some important ways in which Hadot's account of philosophy as a way of life in Greco-Roman philosophy can provide valuable guidance in understanding Buddhist philosophy, as well as some limitations of this guidance, and I recommend it for this reason.

[1] For example, see John M. Cooper, Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy from Socrates to Plotinus, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2012).

[2] See Pierre Hadot, What is Ancient Philosophy? trans. Michael Chase (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2002), pp. 172-9.

[3] See in particular, Martha C. Nussbaum, The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994) and Richard Sorabji, Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000). Both figures are referred to by Collins in a note on p. 42.

[4] See also McClintock's endorsement of work by Harter on the value of the philosophical analysis of doctrines (pp. 91-5).

[5] It might be claimed that analytic interpreters of Buddhist philosophy, by focusing on problems and arguments, are insufficiently concerned with practice and context. However, in my judgment, this would not be a fair characterization of their body of work as a whole.

[6] However, Collins sees a form of mysticism in Hadot's account (see pp. 65-6).

[7] For examples of such analyses, see Peter J. Vernezze, "Moderation or the Middle Way: Two Approaches to Anger," Philosophy East and West 58 (2008): 2-16 and Emily McRae, "Emotions, Ethics and Choice: Lessons from Tsongkhapa," Journal of Buddhist Ethics 19 (2012): 342-69.