Buffy the Vampire Slayer and Philosophy: Fear and Trembling in Sunnydale

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South, James B. (ed.), Buffy the Vampire Slayer and Philosophy: Fear and Trembling in Sunnydale, Open Court Press, 2003, 335pp, $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 0812695313.

Reviewed by Karen Bennett, Princeton University


Buffy the Vampire Slayer and Philosophy—an intriguing title, especially if, like me, you are both a professional philosopher and a rabid Buffy fan. The question, though, is what exactly can be made of the conjunction. How much philosophy is there in Buffy the Vampire Slayer (BtVS)? Can we really use BtVS to do philosophy? More generally, how should we think about the intersection of philosophy and things like television, film, and literature? After all, South’s collection is the fourth volume in a series called ’Philosophy and Popular Culture’, with previous volumes entitled Seinfeld and Philosophy, The Simpsons and Philosophy, and The Matrix and Philosophy.

It seems to me that there are three main ways to use popular culture—or, more precisely, fiction1 —to do philosophy. First, one might write an introductory book using a television show, movie, or what have you in order to illustrate various philosophical positions and debates, either for a popular audience, or for an introductory course. The aim here is straightforwardly pedagogical. It’s just an extended version of what we do when we start talking about The Matrix in a lecture on Descartes, read from The Brothers Karamazov when discussing the problem of evil, or show that Star Trek episode about whether Data counts as a person during a unit on the mind-body problem. Done well, this model can be a wonderful thing. Movies and television shows are gripping and easily accessible, and can draw students into the dusty old tomes—or technical contemporary articles—that they are otherwise inclined to shun.

The second way to use popular culture to do philosophy is closely related to the first. Here, the idea is to mention the bit of popular culture in passing, in order to illustrate or exemplify some philosophical idea being developed in a professional book or article. Perhaps the author uses a quote as an epigraph, inserts a quick paragraph describing a scene, or develops a thought experiment based on some incident or device in a story. Consider the use of teletransportation in the personal-identity literature. Or, to take a more specific example off the top of my head, consider Michael Smith and Jeanette Kennett’s use of Arnold Lobel’s children’s story Frog and Toad Lose Control as the basis of a discussion of self-control and weakness of the will. Again, this second model is really just the first model scaled up to a professional level. The distinction between the two is mostly a matter of who the intended audience is, and whether the author is presenting her own arguments or explaining someone else’s.

Third, one might use various examples from film, television, or literature to develop and argue for a position in aesthetics. Pieces of popular culture could presumably be used to defend a view about the nature of beauty, what counts as art, or some other variation on that general theme. Here, the use of the popular culture is a bit more direct than the above. The films or what not provide more than mere analogies, and more than mere fictional examples of a philosophical point; they constitute real examples of the philosophical point. After all, in aesthetics, the philosophical point will be primarily about the representations themselves, rather than about the people and events represented.

But notice what all three of these models have in common. None of them are in any interesting sense about the fictional content of whatever bit of fiction they use. Instead, they are about, well, whatever issue they are about—skepticism, the existence and nature of god, the relationship of mind to body, the nature of action, what counts as art. Sadly, only a few of the essays in Buffy the Vampire Slayer and Philosophy are genuinely about any interesting philosophical issue. Most of them are instead straightforwardly about BtVS. That is, they use philosophical ideas to illuminate BtVS, rather than the other way around. In his introduction, South even says that while “some chapters start with a difficult philosophical issue … and show how BtVS can help us to better understand the issue by providing us with examples and themes from the show” (2), other chapters “use philosophical concepts to understand the stories and motifs present in BtVS” (3, italics mine). But in my view there are far too many of the latter, and I am frankly dubious that they count as philosophy at all.

The book contains twenty-two essays, divided into five sections. The first is called “Buffy, Faith, and Feminism,” and consists of two essays about Faith and three on more general feminist topics. The five essays in “Knowledge, Rationality, and Science in the Buffyverse,” include an interesting discussion (by Andrew Aberdein) of the relationship between science and magic in the Buffyverse, and another (by Madeleine Muntersbjorn)on the show’s implicit attitude towards the ’Science Wars’. We then have four essays on “Buffy and Ethics”, followed by five on “Religion and Politics in the Buffyverse”. The fifth and final section, “Watching Buffy,” seems to be a catch-all for three essays that did not neatly fit elsewhere.2 In what follows, I am going to dispense with plot summary and character description and assume that if you are interested enough to read this review, you have at least a basic familiarity with the characters and overall plotlines.

Some of these essays really do contain at least some philosophical content. I have already mentioned Aberdein’s “Balderdash and Chicanery: Science and Beyond” and Muntersbjorn’s “Pluralism, Pragmatism, and Pals: The Slayer Subverts the Science Wars”. Others include Mimi Marinucci’s “Feminism and the Ethics of Violence: Why Buffy Kicks Ass,” in which she raises some interesting questions about when violence is called for. In “Buffy in the Buff: A Slayer’s Solution to Aristotle’s Love Paradox,” Melissa M. Milavec and Sharon M. Kaye draw on Buffy’s three main sexual relationships to illustrate Aristotle’s three levels of friendship. (Even Buffy fans unfamiliar with Aristotle will be unsurprised to hear that Angel wins, Reilly loses, and Spike is a ’pleasure friend’.) And Carolyn Korsmeyer’s “Passion and Action: In and Out of Control” reflects on the nature of the emotions, as well as their contribution to the aesthetic power of the show.

But the real winners on the yes-this-actually-is-philosophy! front are Jacob Held and Jason Kawal. Held’s “Justifying the Means: Punishment in the Buffyverse” is a nice reflection on the nature of punishment that falls somewhere in between my first and second models of how to use popular culture to do philosophy. Held uses BtVS to illustrate the difference between retributivist and utilitarian theories of punishment, and to argue that the latter is preferable to the former. He reminds us that the vengeance demon Halfrek “prefers the title ’justice demon’“ (229), and contrasts her chosen ’clientele’ and methodology to Anya’s. On the basis of this contrast, he argues that there is no fully objective way to determine a criminal’s just deserts, and thus that retributivism is untenable. He then uses the cases of Angel, Spike, and Oz to illustrate the virtues of preemptive punishment in the interests of deterrence. Finally, he approaches the difficult question of whether utilitarianism justifies punishing the innocent by discussing—and applauding—Giles’ decision to kill Ben at the end of season 6. (Ben is an entirely innocent human; the problem is that the nasty goddess Glory needs to use his body to manifest herself.) I’m not convinced that any of this really constitutes a novel argument in favor of utilitarianism or against retributivism, but it certainly brings the key issues to the fore, and I can see myself assigning this in an introductory class.

In “Should We Do What Buffy Would Do?” Kawal argues that virtue ethicists are not well served by saying, with Rosalind Hursthouse (1999), that

an action is right iff it is what a virtuous agent would characteristically … do in the circumstances (149).

After all, the fact that each of us has different abilities and relationships from the paradigm virtuous person (Buffy, Jesus, Buddha …) may well affect whether we indeed should do what that person would do. For example, it is not morally right for Xander to take on a pack of vampires alone, even though Buffy characteristically would. And although we can instead ask what Buffy would do if she had Xander’s less impressive physical abilities, it is clear that this is a dangerous road. Follow it too far, and you wind up telling Xander that he should do what Buffy would do if she were Xander, which does not exactly give him much in the way of moral compass! So the virtue ethicist should modify her claim slightly, and say that

an action in a given situation is morally right if (and only if) a fully-informed, unimpaired, virtuous observer (like Buffy) would deem the action to be morally right (for this person) (158).

Now, I am not familiar enough with the literature on virtue ethics to know whether this is either original or fair to Hursthouse. But I can say without hesitation that this is philosophy. This is an instance of the second model above. The essay is not about BtVS, though Buffy’s name appears on every page; it is about the proper formulation of a key principle of virtue ethics.

As I have already indicated, though, many of the other essays really are just about BtVS. They provide character analyses, untangle themes, uncover metaphors, and offer diagnoses of political motivations and hidden agendas. This is all well and good, and fun for the Buffyphile in me, but it’s not philosophy.

So is that fair? I rather expect some readers to accuse me of being a snooty, closed-minded analytic philosopher. I must plead guilty to the ’analytic’ bit, but that’s all. I will happily admit that questions about disciplinary boundaries can be tricky, and not always worth pursuing very far. And I will certainly agree that questions about exactly what counts as philosophy—and why—are quite hard, and that a detailed answer is well beyond the scope of this review. Nonetheless, the general outlines of the answer are fairly clear. It’s partly a matter of topic, and partly a matter of methodology.

The methodological component is simply that philosophy crucially involves argument. If an essay provides no arguments, but rather meanders around, makes proclamations, or simply describes a view without trying to evaluate it, then the author is not doing philosophy. It is worth noting in this regard that the simple fact that BtVS embodies a certain worldview or adheres to a certain –ism is not an argument for the truth of that –ism. It is at best an argument for the claim that the writers believe the –ism. BtVS is, after all, fictional. Not all of the contributors to this volume are careful enough about this point.3

The subject matter component is harder. Luckily, I do not need to provide a very substantive account, or a comprehensive list of the Properly Philosophical Topics. All I need to say is that BtVS is not among them. This is not a slur on BtVS; neither Hamlet nor Ulysses is among them either. Philosophy is not English Literature or Media Studies. Thus when Thomas Hibbs—in one of the best essays in the volume—argues that “the mythic structure and leitfmotifs of BtVS reflect noir themes” (51), or when Wendy Love Anderson argues that “the Buffyverse conception of religion is … regularly and frequently … demonized” (214), they are not doing philosophy. Philosophers are simply not in the business of studying the fictional content of fictions.4 We want to know what the real world contains, and how it works.

Let me finish by issuing three caveats about what I’ve said here. First, I want to be clear that most of the essays in this volume can teach someone a little bit of philosophy, whether it be a bit of Plato, Aristotle, Nietzsche, or Kant, or what was at stake in the ’Science Wars’. After all, even those who put the philosophical ideas in the service of understanding BtVS rather than vice versa need to explain those ideas. It’s just that in essays that are not written with clear pedagogical intent, any knowledge gained is only accidental, and likely to be very incomplete.

Second, I really do think that there is interesting philosophical mileage to be gotten from BtVS—at least pedagogically. I’ve already discussed some interesting issues that are covered in this collection. There’s probably more work to be done in ethics. And I was surprised that none of the authors discussed personal identity, freedom of the will, or moral responsibility—themes that are often fairly close to the surface in BtVS. Notice too that Dawn practically is Davidson’s Swampman (1987),5 and therefore provides a handy example for certain debates about the nature of concepts and content. She also nicely illustrates most standard views about species individuation—which entail that she is not biologically human—as well as Shoemaker’s (1970) distinction between memory and quasi-memory that arises in discussions of personal identity. So BtVS really does raise some interesting philosophical issues.

Perhaps more importantly, though, it raises lots of interesting non philosophical issues. This is my third caveat: the fact that many of these essays are not philosophy does not automatically mean that they are bad. With a few exceptions—which belong in fanzines rather than tenure files—the nonphilosophical essays in this collection range from the silly but mildly enjoyable to the really quite intriguing. After all, philosophy is not the only academic discipline, and academia is not the only worthwhile pursuit. At the end of the day, I am as happy to sit around talking about BtVS as the next fan. I just don’t pretend to be doing philosophy. So if South’s collection were instead called something like Reflections on Buffy the Vampire Slayer, I would probably complain a lot less. Then again, if it were called that, I wouldn’t be reviewing it here.


Davidson, Donald. 1987. Knowing one’s own mind. Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 60: 441-458.

Hursthouse, Rosalind. 1999. On Virtue Ethics. NY: Oxford University Press.

Shoemaker, Sydney. 1970. Persons and their pasts. American Philosophical Quarterly 7: 269-285.

Smith, Michael, and Kennett, Jeanette. 1996. Frog and Toad lose control. Analysis 56: 63-73.


1. First, there are many nonfiction bits of popular culture that are just not at stake here. For example, it is hard to see any philosophical use for celebrity gossip and faddish toys. Second, there is a lot of fiction that can’t really be called ’popular culture’ in any natural sense, but which might be philosophically useful in one way or another (note my mention of Dostoevsky just below).

2. Actually, the contribution by Richard Greene and Wayne Yuen should probably have gone in the ethics section, but the contribution by Tracy Little would have posed an editorial challenge, given that it does not even purport to be about anything philosophical. The essay by Michael P. Levine and Stephen Jay Schneider, in contrast, really is about watching BtVS; they are looking for an explanation of the show’s appeal to academics. But while it starts out promisingly, criticizing some of the more excessive claims that have been made in praise of BtVS, and claiming that “it is BtVS scholarship that warrants study at this point, not BtVS itself” (301), it soon falls astray and provides a rather one-dimensional, Freudian explanation of the show’s popularity.

3. The fact that some of these authors do not always put enough weight on the fact that BtVS is not real also gives rise to a different but related mistake. The mistake is to uncritically take anything that happens on the show as evidence for the correctness of a certain interpretation (or even, if conjoined with the mistake in the main text above, as evidence for the truth of some view about the nature of the actual world.) The problem is that sometimes things happen because of the constraints of the medium, or the simple goals of entertaining a television audience. There are occasional inconsistencies in the plotlines and in the behavior of the characters because the show has been written over a period of at least seven years, by a multitude of different writers. And sometimes characters do things ’out of character’, or grow in unexpected directions, to enhance the storyline. This problematizes James B. South’s essay, in which he argues that Willow’s actions in season 6 “force us to confront the possibility that irrationality can be unintelligible, not just a mistake” (133). Here is another example. Toby Daspit makes much of the fact that very little of BtVS takes place in classrooms, despite the fact that, during the first four seasons, most of the main characters are either in school or working at one. He takes it as evidence that “the type of knowledge necessary for survival on the Hellmouth is not discovered … or created … within a banking model. Instead, other modes of knowledge, and of education, are explored” (128). Hmmm. I’d have said that little of the show takes place in classrooms because that would be really boring. Come on, people. Aristotle did not have to worry about Nielsen ratings. Joss Whedon does.

4. That is not to say that they are not interested in fiction qua fiction. The prospects for ’fictionalism’ about various problematic entities—numbers, possible worlds, moral truths—partly turn on working out how to understand the notion of truth according to a fiction. And both philosophers of language and metaphysicians are interested in metaphor. Etc.

5. The force of the ’practically’ depends on whether or not it is central to Davidson’s example that the creature come into existence by cosmic accident, rather than by intentional creation.