Building Better Beings: A Theory of Moral Responsibility

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Manuel Vargas, Building Better Beings: A Theory of Moral Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2013, 345pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199697540.

Reviewed by Tamler Sommers, University of Houston


We all like to believe that the problem we happen to work on is "particularly intractable," more resistant to resolution than debates in any other area of philosophy. The free will debate has a legitimate claim to this title. (Of course, I work in this area myself so I would say that.) The source of the intractability is that our intuitions about freedom and especially moral responsibility do not come in a neat consistent package. It is enormously difficult to develop a coherent view that satisfies our own set of commitments and intuitions, let alone those of other cultures or time periods. Yet a successful theory is supposed to do precisely that: offer a set of general principles that can unify our seemingly inconsistent intuitions. One of the many contributions of Manuel Vargas' book is to offer a principled way of embracing a conception of free will and moral responsibility that does not require even the pretense of success so defined.

Vargas calls his approach revisionism because "it insists that what we ought to think about responsibility conflicts with important threads of how we do think about responsibility." (p. 15) His book is divided into two parts. The first defends his revisionist methodology against the more traditional way of theorizing in the existing literature. The second offers a revisionist theory of responsibility -- the "agency cultivation model" -- that is grounded in the revisionist approach defended in Part One. The volume is long and extraordinarily rich, the culmination of a project Vargas has been developing over many years. I will not pretend that I can address the book in all of its complexity. I will divide my remarks into three sections, each focused on a critical question for Vargas' project. I hope I can elucidate some central aspects of his arguments along the way.

Is Vargas' revisionist theory just another form of compatibilism?

In one sense, the answer is an uncontroversial 'yes.' Vargas believes that we can be morally responsible even if determinism is true; this makes him a compatibilist. On the other hand, Vargas insists that there are important elements of incompatibilist thought that pervade our understanding of freedom and responsibility. This tension is what leads Vargas to distinguish between the "diagnostic project" (determining the nature of our existing commitments) and the "prescriptive project" (determining what our commitments ought to be). According to Vargas, conventional compatibilists only employ the former project in defense of their theories. Their goal is to show that compatibilist principles can ultimately explain our free-will related commitments and intuitions. This approach cannot succeed, Vargas argues, because of the incompatibilist strain in our thinking. It is only by incorporating the prescriptive project into our analysis that we can come up with a satisfactory compatibilist conception of freedom and responsibility.

One might point out that other compatibilists have conceded certain incompatibilist elements in folk thinking. John Martin Fischer, for example, has famously argued that determinism may pose a threat to our concept of free will if it is construed as the "ability to do otherwise". On the topic of moral responsibility, however, Fischer theorizes in a more traditional manner, attempting to show that our intuitions in "reflective equilibrium" favor compatibilism.[1] Vargas does not. Certainly, Vargas is more willing than Fischer and most of his compatibilist colleagues to accept diagnostic incompatibilism about moral responsibility, while still arguing for an ultimately compatibilist conclusion. His account is designed precisely as a means to benefit from the virtues of compatibilism without denying the intuitive pull of incompatibilism.

A more difficult question is how to distinguish Vargas' revisionism from P. F. Strawson's form of compatibilism. Like Vargas, Strawson explicitly incorporates prescriptive elements into his account. When considering whether the acceptance of determinism would make it "rational" to abandon the attitudes associated with moral responsibility, Strawson writes "if we could imagine what we cannot have, viz., a choice in this matter, then we could choose rationally only in the light of an assessment of the gains and losses to human life, its enrichment or impoverishment."[2] Strawson does not concede much or any intuitive ground to incompatibilism. But like Vargas, he does reject the conventional compatibilist form of justification, the search for the best "conceptual fit." As I see it then, Strawson's account is more of a rival form of revisionism.

Perhaps this is why Vargas' central discussion of Strawson comes in Part Two as he is presenting his revisionist theory. Vargas argues that while Strawson's positive account of blameworthiness is "mostly correct," its virtues "do not extend to providing a satisfactory answer to questions of justification that are in some sense external to the practice." (p. 161) But Vargas's challenge here is problematic. Like many of Strawson's critics, Vargas characterizes Strawson's form of justification as grounded almost entirely in the psychological immutability of the reactive attitudes. Vargas then offers the example of "Jealous Dave" to show why "psychological inevitability does not deflect questions about the justification of practices" (p. 162):

Dave experiences strong pangs of jealousy when his wife spends time with her male friends. This feeling is natural to Dave, not one that he is prone to question, and it causes Dave to do what he can to limit his wife's time with these men. Gradually, after reading some articles or books, he starts to wonder whether his behavior is justified. And soon he begins to think that while the feeling may be unavoidable, he should do his best to refrain from acting on it. Vargas writes: "Is Dave making a mistake when he thinks that his behavior might be unjustified? I don't think he is, and I think it is reasonable for him to think this even if he is right that his feelings of jealousy are a fixed feature about himself." (p. 163)

Vargas is clearly correct that Dave can reasonably question his behavior but wrong that this example undermines Strawson's theory. What Strawson denies is that we can reasonably reject the general framework of reactive attitudes and practices. He emphasizes, however, that there is plenty of room for internal revision. We can always question the rationality of particular expressions of an attitude like resentment. We can even reasonably question the expression of resentment in more general kinds of situations. What we cannot do, according to Strawson, is question the rationality of resentment period, as incompatibilists would if determinism were true. Thus, for Vargas' case to serve as a true challenge to Strawson, Jealous Dave would have to reject the rationality of jealousy in all cases. And now the case becomes more controversial: we might think that Dave indeed is making a mistake to do this. Vargas must do more, then, to show that Strawson's justificatory strategy is inferior to his own.

Does Vargas effectively rule out eliminativism?

Chapter One argues there are incompatibilist elements in our ordinary ways of thinking about freedom and responsibility. Chapter Two argues against the plausibility of libertarianism. The natural question is why Vargas does not simply deny that we have the kind of free will that would make us morally responsible, as philosophers such as Derk Pereboom, Galen Strawson, and Bruce Waller (among others) have done. Vargas' answer comes in the last two chapters of Part One, where he argues for revisionism as a more plausible alternative to eliminativism or nihilism. He begins by noting that there are plenty of concepts that have not conformed fully to our evolving understanding of the world. However, discovering that a concept does not have the nature we originally thought does not force us to eliminate it from our vocabulary. Consider the concept of water. We used to think that water was one of the four indivisible substances. The discovery that water was composed of separate elements did not make us become water nihilists. It was far more plausible simply to revise our understanding of the nature of water. And the same is true, Vargas argues, of other more normative concepts such as marriage or perhaps race.

Of course, there are also examples of concepts where eliminativism was the most plausible route, including 'phlogiston,' 'witches,' 'unicorns,' and 'demonic possession.' Vargas' task, as I understand it, is to show that moral responsibility belongs in the former category rather than the latter. He begins with a promising analogy: Friedrich is a theist who believes that the content of morality is determined by God's decrees; over time he begins to lose his faith and eventually becomes an atheist. The question: what should Friedrich think about the status of morality? As Vargas correctly points out, eliminativism is not his only option. He might also revise his concept of morality so that it doesn't require the existence of God. The analogy is potentially fruitful because an analysis of why revisionism is appropriate for Friedrich could shed light on why it might be appropriate for intuitive incompatibilists. But rather than pursue this analysis, Vargas drops the analogy and turns to a discussion of libertarian alternate possibilities, how they do not help to give us the freedom we think is necessary for moral responsibility. This is a frustrating shift in direction, for Vargas has already expressed his doubts about libertarianism in the previous chapter. The ostensible reason for the discussion here is to show that our concept of moral responsibility as involving alternative possibilities cannot give us what we want anyway. But it's not clear why this point should persuade eliminativists to rethink their position. It is as though someone was trying to convince Friedrich to become a revisionist about morality by showing that God couldn't have provided the content for morality even if he existed. That may be true. But if I'm Friedrich I want to hear a positive case for revisionism over eliminativism, not more evidence that my previous concept was confused or mistaken.

The remainder of Part One presents a wearying array of terms and distinctions (denotational vs. connotational revisionism, systematic vs. repurposing revisionism, internalist vs. externalist theories of reference, semantic agnosticism, diagnostic correction and so forth). In my view, this terminology serves more to clutter the argument than to elucidate it. The crucial question of why we should think that 'moral responsibility' is more like 'water' and 'marriage' than 'phlogiston' and 'witches' ends up getting lost in the intricacies of his revisionist machinery.

Vargas does offer some trenchant criticism of philosophers like Pereboom and Galen Strawson, who merely assume that the incompatibilist elements in ordinary thought make eliminativism the only plausible outcome. Unfortunately, Vargas does not do enough to make himself immune to the same challenge. By the end of Part One, Vargas had convinced me that revisionism was a possible alternative but not that it was the most plausible one. Perhaps this is not possible in the space of two chapters. A compelling general defense of revisionism would likely require a book of its own. In that case, a much shorter discussion of Vargas' methodological assumptions would have been sufficient as an introduction to the particular revisionist theory of responsibility that Vargas defends in the second part of the book.

Does Vargas offer a compelling positive account?

If I seem overly critical of Part One, it may be because of how much I admired Vargas' work in Part Two. It is here that Vargas presents a fully fleshed out revisionist account of moral responsibility: the "agency cultivation model." What makes the theory revisionist is the way in which it justifies our responsibility-related practices and beliefs. As noted above, conventional accounts evaluate beliefs and practices about blame and praise according to how well they conform to our considered intuitions. Vargas's criterion, by contrast, concerns whether the practices "[foster] a distinctive form of agency in us, a kind of agency sensitive to and governed by moral considerations." (p. 173). The final six chapters make a comprehensive and compelling case that our responsibility practices can indeed satisfy this criterion.

In my favorite chapter, "Blame and Desert," Vargas introduces a crucial component of his theory: the moral ecology of responsibility, which he defines as "the circumstances that support and enable exercises of agency in ways that respect and reflect a concern for morality." (p. 246) Vargas argues that we must be sensitive to these circumstances when determining the norms that ought to govern our responsibility practices. Since moral ecology varies across time and culture, it is futile to look for a single set of justified norms for blame and praise. A change in moral ecology can change our capacities for moral agency in ways that our responsibility system must take into account. Indeed, it might even strip the system of its underlying justification. Vargas writes that while the prescriptive benefits of his account provide us with adequate warrant for rejecting responsibility nihilism for now, "it is not a warrant in perpetuity." (p. 238). It all depends on the circumstances of our current social world. Another implication is that further empirical discoveries about the kind of agency we possess in this world could lead to changes in justified blaming norms or even to a wholesale rejection of them.

This is just a taste of the fascinating and rigorous analysis featured in the second part of the book. In one sense, the strength of the arguments here undermines my central objection to Part One. The compelling nature of Vargas' positive account might be precisely what makes revisionism about responsibility more plausible than nihilism and eliminativism. The problem is that the positive account operates under revisionist assumptions, in particular the legitimacy of incorporating prescriptive elements into our understanding of free will and moral responsibility. A hard incompatibilist might agree with Vargas' that our responsibility practices foster the right sort of moral agency but still maintain that the concept is too infused with incompatibilist elements to be preserved.

Vargas writes in his introduction that Part Two "is the heart of the book" and indeed "might well have been the book" (p. 17) except that readers might not be familiar with the latest version of his revisionist machinery. In my view, Vargas would have been better served to make Part Two the book or at least most of it. Building Better Beings is long, dense, and difficult to read. Certain readers may be tempted to abandon ship before they get to the best chapters. I strongly urge them not to because the rewards of these chapters are considerable. In the end, Vargas has achieved something that is quite rare: he has given us an entirely new way to approach an ancient and, yes, seemingly intractable problem.

[1] Although see Fischer's chapters in Four Views on Free Will (Blackwell, 2007) for a possible complication, and Vargas' discussion in this book (p. 90, n. 18).

[2] P. F. Strawson, "Freedom and Resentment," in G. Watson (ed.), Free Will, Oxford University Press, 1982, p. 70.