By Parallel Reasoning: The Construction and Evaluation of Analogical Arguments

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Paul Bartha, By Parallel Reasoning: The Construction and Evaluation of Analogical Arguments, Oxford University Press, 2010, 356pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195325539.

Reviewed by Kenny Easwaran, University of Southern California


Analogy is a very difficult topic to write about. Arguments by analogy are much weaker than arguments of better understood forms (like deductive or statistical arguments), and thus they are typically employed in domains that we don't yet understand well enough to apply more definitive arguments. The weakness of the arguments, and the diversity of domains in which they are applied, make the phenomenon itself hard to classify.

In this book, Paul Bartha puts forth a simple theory of what it takes for an argument by analogy to work and uses this theory to illuminate many other features of analogies. He has important insights about the sort of connection that must obtain between the properties analogized, which leads to some broader points about the relation between an individual argument by analogy and broader analogical reasoning. He is also greatly concerned with the distinction between describing the way we actually reason by analogy and giving a normative account of when these analogies should be taken as a guide to plausibility. And he argues that this is all we should expect from analogy -- an argument can convince us that a conclusion is plausible, but can never really do much to give it substantial support.

Chapter 1 sets up the basic model for an argument by analogy and argues that we need to pay attention to the dependence relations among the properties that lead to the analogy, rather than just counting up the similarities between two domains. Chapters 2 and 3 consider previous theories of analogy given by philosophers and cognitive scientists, and these chapters show why they either fail or address psychological rather than logical questions. Chapter 4 uses the pattern of dependence relations to categorize types of arguments by analogy, based on whether the predicted similarity is expected to cause the known similarities, explain them, or stand in some other relation. This categorization is quite interesting and constitutes one of the main insights of the book; I will discuss it in detail later.

Chapters 5 and 6 then look at many particular arguments by analogy from the history of mathematics and science to show how the general model and the particular categorizations work. After this discussion that shows his model is useful for understanding actual arguments by analogy, Bartha gives two arguments for the conclusion that his model gets at the normative force behind them. Chapter 7 gives a higher-level analogy between the role of analogies in law and the role of analogies in science. It's an interesting argument, but I think that it fails. Chapter 8, however, gives a much better developed argument that shows how a sort of symmetry reasoning requires us to accept the conclusions of arguments by analogy as plausible, and shows how this can be fit into a broadly Bayesian framework. Chapter 9 then closes by discussing a few other issues in the use of analogy. Each chapter begins with an outline that sketches how the sections fit together towards the larger argument. This clarity is admirable, not least because of the many types of vagueness and unclarity that inevitably arise in any discussion of analogy.

His theory of argument by analogy, which he calls the "articulation model," is as follows. There is a "source domain" and a "target domain" for the argument. The argument takes some property Q of the source domain and argues that it is plausible that an analog Q* holds in the target domain. To do this, we must find some other properties of the source domain that have a "prior association" to Q and a "potential for generalization", and isolate which ones are "critical" and which ones are only "secondary". He says that the argument makes Q* plausible iff there is at least one critical property that is known to be shared between the two domains and no critical properties that are known to not be shared; the more critical or secondary properties that are shared, the stronger the analogy, and the more secondary properties that are not shared, the weaker the analogy.

Note that the requirements here are quite weak -- a single shared feature between the domains is sufficient, in the absence of critical defeaters. I was worried about this for much of the book, but the argument in chapter 8 managed to allay most of my worries. I think it is the most significant argument in the book, so I will discuss it at length here.

This argument begins by considering someone who is buying a used car. She sees two cars on the lot which share all properties that are relevant to her decision of whether or not to buy -- they have the same price, same make, same year, same color (if she cares about that), and so on for all properties that she cares about. Bartha says that in this situation, it would be irrational for her to prefer one car to the other, since there is no relevant difference.

In the next case, we consider someone who is considering several options for a used car, some of which she knows more about than others. Depending on her preferences, she may be able to rule some of them out based on her incomplete knowledge. However, Bartha says that if one car is still a live option, and another car is known to share some relevant features with it, and is not known to differ on any relevant features, then the second car should also be a live option. Again, this seems quite plausible.

Suppose that in some situation (i) one's evaluation of several choices depends only on features F1,F2,F3, (ii) one knows that options A and B agree on F1, (iii) one knows the value of F2 for A, and (iv) one doesn't know the values of F2 for B or F3 for either A or B. Then, he says, if A is still a live option, then B should be as well. This is because the range of possible evaluations one has for B includes the range of possible valuations one has for A, and thus if there is some possibility that A will turn out to be the best option, then there is some possibility for B as well. Of course, he doesn't argue for the converse. If a car that is known to be a red 2006 Toyota Prius is a live option, then one that is known to be a red Toyota should be a live option too. But the converse doesn't hold -- the buyer may specifically want a blue car, or may specifically want a 2009 SUV rather than a 2006 Prius. If those features are critical for the agent, then the analogy may be blocked.

This leads to the version for theories. If a domain D1 has some known features P and it is plausible that it has Q as well, then if another domain D2 is known to share some of the relevant features and is not known to differ along any relevant features, then Q should also be plausible for D2 as well.

Thinking about the analogy with the used car purchase helps clarify what work is being done by the notion of being "plausible". When we have two cars that are both known to have some relevant features, and one is known to have more of them, we will shape our decision by investigating further the unknown relevant features of each car. In situations where we are very limited in the amount of research we can do, we may go for the one with the more known features, but when research is possible we will continue to pursue both. Since mathematical and scientific reasoning generally take place in the sort of situation where further research is possible (and encouraged), it seems that the existence of any positive analogy will lead us to investigate further the similarities between the two domains, either to find relevant disanalogies or to extend the analogy further. And this is exactly the process that leads from a single argument by analogy to a more extended pattern of analogical reasoning, which is an important insight of this book: the value of an analogy consists not just in the plausibility it gives to its conclusion but also to the pattern of future research that it generates.

One example that Bartha discusses at several points throughout the book may illustrate this. This is the example of the analogical argument, initially due to Thomas Reid, for the existence of life on Mars. He pointed out that, like the Earth, Mars orbits the sun and is illuminated by it, is orbited by at least one moon, and rotates about its axis. Thus he suggests that it is plausible that there could be life on Mars. Later research on Mars was often guided by questions suggested by this analogy, and the considerations I will discuss later about which features are critical to it. It seems clear that on Earth the presence of an atmosphere and liquid water are essential for life. When it was discovered that Mars lacks these, that greatly diminished the analogy, until it was discovered that these attributes were in fact present on Mars several billion years ago. The low temperature of Mars was shown not to be a relevant disanalogy by the discovery of various types of life within the Antarctic ice caps and rocks. However, conjectures that life may have first emerged on Earth in the special chemical conditions of tide pools suggest that the fact that Mars's moons are too small to have ever generated tides may be a critical disanalogy. What started as idle speculation about extraterrestrial life has helped shape our knowledge both of the conditions on Mars and the conditions relevant for the origin of life on Earth.

After giving the informal argument for the plausibility of the conclusion of an argument by analogy, Bartha shows how to give a sort of Bayesian framework for a more precise version of the same conclusion. He defines a notion of "partial probability assignments" that agents use when working in partially unfamiliar domains and shows how the use of symmetry considerations (though nothing nearly so strong as the full "Principle of Indifference") in setting the priors for new extensions of the assignment will result in analogous conclusions getting non-negligible probability. Full discussion of this model is outside the scope of this review and probably much larger than the scope of one chapter in a book on analogy.

In a recent survey paper about Bayesianism (Easwaran 2011), I argued that the four main problems for Bayesianism are the problems of logical omniscience, old evidence, new theories, and the problem of the priors. And Bartha raises exactly these four problems as major issues that arise in his Bayesian reconstruction of the reason for finding analogies plausible. He suggests that analogies may play a large role in our setting priors, especially in situations where new theories have been introduced. We can't see an analogy as confirming the conclusion, but merely as telling us that the conclusion is worthy of investigation. This is largely because analogies consist primarily of old evidence. The problem of logical omniscience arises in applying his account to analogies in mathematics. His framework doesn't provide a solution to these four problems but merely shows that the sorts of features Bayesians propose in these solutions could be used to support the role he sees for analogy. Of course, an anti-Bayesian who finds these problems devastating will be uninterested in his Bayesian approach, but she can still accept the earlier informal version of the argument.

I would like to see this formalism developed more thoroughly, and my one comment for now is that it might be even more powerful if couched in terms of sets of probability functions -- just as a car buyer has a range of values consistent with her incomplete knowledge about a car, a theorist has a range of prior probabilities consistent with her incomplete knowledge about a theory. As long as the analogy leads the theorist to let some of these priors be quite large, the conclusion will be plausible and worthy of future study, which is all that an analogy should lead us to believe.

In contrast to this argument from chapter 8, the argument by analogy to law in chapter 7 seems quite flawed. It seems to me that Bartha doesn't consider a sufficient range of alternative procedures to the use of analogy, either in science or law, to show why it is required in case law jurisdictions to rule on the basis of analogy and permitted in science to pursue theories on the basis of analogy.

Apart from the argument in chapter 8, the other main interest in this book is the classification of analogies in chapter 4 on the basis of the "prior association" that is known to hold among the relevant properties, as well as the discussion in the next two chapters of what sorts of factors count as "critical" or "secondary" for each type of analogy. Bartha makes a strong case that the relation between the known similarities and the proposed similarity is more important than the number or type of similarities. There are cases where known similar causes are predicted to have similar effects. (For instance, we know that in animals, beta-blockers affect heart rate by blocking the receptors for adrenaline, and we know that adrenaline affects heart rate in humans the same way, so we suppose that beta-blockers will similarly affect heart rate in humans.) There are also cases where known similar effects are predicted to have similar causes. (For instance, Priestley knew that a hollow sphere of charge had zero net electric force inside and that the inverse square law of gravity produces zero net gravitational force inside a hollow sphere of mass, and thus proposed that electric force also had an inverse square law.) There are also interesting cases from evolution and archaeology where the proposed similarity is the function of some adaptation or artifact that is known to be similar, so that the causal dependence goes in both directions. And finally, there are cases where the association is merely statistical.

Bartha considers each of these four types of association, and for the first two also considers whether the known association is deductive or causal, and thus classifies analogies into six types. For each type he gives a detailed investigation of many cases and gives a suggestion for how to figure out which types of features are critical to an analogy and which merely secondary. Some of this consideration of cases is quite illuminating, but some seems to be more ad hoc. For instance, for the deductive cases it's clear that we don't need to know that the known similarities between the domains entail the proposed similarity in the target domain, or else we would have no need for the analogy. But Bartha then says that in explanatory cases like the inverse square law one mentioned above, it is crucial that in the target domain we know that the proposed similarity would in fact entail the known similarities if it were true.

There are similar issues with his consideration of what notion of similarity between two domains is relevant for different types of analogy. He is surely right in chapter 3 when he says that the theories of cognitive scientists merely attempt to show what we psychologically take to be a similarity, rather than giving a logical account of what sorts of similarity ought to be relevant. But he doesn't give very much of a positive account of his own. He says,

it is both feasible and valuable for theories of analogical reasoning to avoid three prevalent and misleading assumptions: (1) that relations of similarity can always be reduced to identity and difference, (2) that interdomain similarities can best be modeled by the notion of isomorphism, and (3) that similarity is a non-analyzable primitive relation… . Instead, we should move to a pluralistic approach that aims for a set of precise, but diverse, models of similarity… . Although a theory of analogical arguments can strive for precise models, we should not expect to eliminate entirely the role of good judgment in the evaluation of analogical arguments. (p. 187)

It seems to me that even these separate models of similarity are not as precise as one might like. And leaving some of the evaluation up to "good judgment" seems to be giving up on the idea that there even can be a model. But Bartha’s categorization of arguments based on the patterns of dependence or association between the relevant properties is surely an important advance. Future researchers in the field will undoubtedly build on this categorization, and, I hope, will say more about the similarities and differences between these different types of analogies.


Easwaran, Kenny. "Bayesianism II: Applications and Criticisms". Philosophy Compass 6:5 (2011) 321-332.