Byzantine Philosophy and its Ancient Sources

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Ierodiakonou, Katerina (ed.), Byzantine Philosophy and its Ancient Sources, Oxford University Press, 2002, 320pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199246130

Reviewed by R.J. Hankinson, University of Texas at Austin


“The title of this volume leaves no doubt as to its main objective”, writes the editor at the beginning of her introduction: “the articles here are meant to shed light on Byzantine philosophy against the background of ancient philosophical thought”. And as she justly remarks a paragraph later “Byzantine philosophy remains an unknown field”. Was there even any such thing in its own right? “Isn’t it all theology”, as a later subtitle provocatively asks? The function of such a volume is to return the answer “No” to that syntactically yes-expecting question. And the purpose of this review is to assess how far it succeeds in so doing.

Of course, Byzantine philosophy was done against a heavily (sometimes repressively) religious background -- but then so too was mediaeval philosophy in the west, and most of us are prepared, if sometimes grudgingly, to allow that some real philosophizing took place in Europe in the Middle Ages. Ierodiakonou proposes that we allow, at least for the sake of argument, “that philosophy in Byzantium is an autonomous discipline” (in some sense) and see what fruit can be gathered on the basis of such an assumption.

No matter where one decides to draw the chronological boundaries of such a study (a process which is, as Ierodiakonou stresses, obviously to some degree an arbitrary one), the period is a vast one; even if we choose to begin only with Justinian’s anti-pagan decrees of 529, and to end with the fall of Constantinople in 1453, it still lasts nearly a millennium; and as Ierodiakonou notes, there are good reasons to begin earlier and end later (the east was distinctively eastern soon after the founding of Constantinople; and Greek influence and intellectual activity did not simply vanish with the establishment of Ottoman power). The volume contains eleven substantial contributions, and the figures discussed range from the 4th-century Basil of Caesarea to George Scholarios, who remained active under the new order until his death in 1472. I shall discuss -- necessarily briefly -- most of these articles and then offer a few general remarks in conclusion.

Sten Ebbesen begins with an enormously learned and authoritative general survey of “Greek-Latin Philosophical Interaction” from antiquity to the renaissance. He identifies five successive waves of Greek influence on Latin culture, the first dating from the end of the Roman Republic, involving the efforts of Cicero, Lucretius and others to make Greek learning available in Latin (the Hellenizing movement was not of course purely philosophical); and there was at least one period in which the commerce was in the other direction, during the period of Venetian dominance that follows the fourth “Crusade” in the early 13th century, when Latin philosophical texts began, for the first time, to be rendered into Greek by Planoudes and others. But Ebbesen’s main point is that this traffic was, until the very end of the period, almost exclusively in one direction or the other -- there was very little actual intermingling of ideas until the fifteenth century and after.

This fact means that we might expect Byzantine philosophy, when we discover it, to be altogether more exotic and alien. And perhaps it is. But the first case-study of a particular individual concerns the period when the east and the west are still nominally at any rate part of the same Empire. Paul Kalligas examines “Basil of Caesarea on the Semantics of Proper Names”, contending that Basil managed to elaborate an interesting and original variant on the available existing theories. Basil is writing against the position of Eunomius, who advocated an extreme version of the view that there were divinely ordained “proper” proper names for things, which could only be attained by revelation. Basil, by contrast, thinks that names pick out individuals by standing for some sort of “concept” associated with the particular (contingent) attributes of the name’s bearer. Thus Kalligas compares it to contemporary “cluster-theories”. His article ranges very far and very wide; philosophy of language from Plato to Kripke is evoked, and ancient theories are evaluated in the light of modern distinctions (between denotation and connotation, sense and reference). Far more than any other contribution to the volume, this article practices what might be called the contemporary analytical method of the history of philosophy. I am (usually) an adherent of the method—but here it seems to yield distinctly unsatisfying results. Perhaps I’m missing something, but I do not see anything very significant, or very interesting, in Basil’s theory. Kalligas’s analysis is clever (perhaps too clever) – but ultimately unconvincing (he also, on p. 35, without comment offers an extremely heterodox account of the Stoic amputation paradox, one which -- as far as I can see -- fails to make any sense of it; but I have no space to discuss that here).

Dominic O’Meara examines a fragmentary dialogue on political science sometimes attributed to Peter the Patrician, a high-ranking bureaucrat in Justinian’s court. The dialogue attacks Plato’s conception of the ideal city but deals with the issue of the nature and justification of ruling from a recognizably Neoplatonic standpoint; political science is necessitated by the intermediate nature of the human condition, neither fully rational nor fully irrational, neither divine nor material. O’Meara effectively identifies the structural traces of Neoplatonic influence on the text; but it also draws on what O’Meara himself characterizes as “a banality of the literature of monarchy of the Hellenistic and Roman imperial periods” (p. 55), namely the idea that “kingly science is an imitation of God, or an assimilation to God”. Still, it retains its Platonic flavor—the upshot being that good rulers must imitate divine attributes of goodness, wisdom and justice. This will strike some (myself included) as fairly small beer— and it is tempting to see the text as simply an attempt by a courtier to curry favor with an autocrat by providing a largely spurious “philosophical” justification for absolutism. Its author (as O’Meara concludes by emphasizing) elevates temporal kingship over that of the church, in opposition to the views of pseudo-Dionysius. It may thus also be seen (although O’Meara does not make this point) as one round in a long battle, fought in the west at least as much as in the east, between the rival claims of the church and of temporal authority to precedence.

Michael Frede contributes a characteristically challenging and thoughtful piece on “John of Damascus on Human Action, the Will and Human Freedom”. The term preferred by John for the faculty of the will is thelêsis, rather than the boulêsis (wishing) or prohairesis (choice) of the classical tradition. This is no accident, Frede argues—for John wanted to emphasize aspects of his understanding of the will, of its relation to reason, choice, and appetite, and of its role in locating humanity (and other created intelligences) in the divine order of things that would have been quite foreign (indeed unintelligible) to Aristotle. Inter alia, Frede offers a sketch of John’s complex, multi-layered analysis, and some stimulating thoughts of his own on the relation of willing to choosing and the availability of options. His article is a judicious mixture of fine scholarship, acute history of ideas, and philosophy, the upshot of which is that it is reasonable to see John as a pivotal figure in the development of what is to become the Thomist conception of the will as a separate faculty (or perhaps faculties), independent of both reason and desire, although obviously related to them. And this account is both historically and philosophically plausible—for we know that John’s work was indeed read and absorbed in the high Middle Ages in the west.

Jonathan Barnes offers a typically acute piece analyzing the logic theory in a text known (since 1929) as the “anon Heiberg”. Although its authorship is unknown, it can, unusually, be very precisely dated: a reference in the chapter on astronomy shows that it was composed in the autumn of 1007. It is not, Barnes allows, in any way original (in a pugnacious footnote Barnes questions whether originality is all it’s cracked up to be; certainly other contributors seek, sometimes rather desperately, to discern flashes of novelty in their subjects). What it is is a shortish digest of standard Aristotelian logical theory; that is, Aristotle’s theory, supplemented in standard ways. It deals, among other things, with the logic of “undetermined” propositions (“men walk” -- Barnes rightly castigates the usual `translation’ “man walks” as barbaric: 101, n 27). Aristotle certainly mentions such propositions as forming a separate class in de Intepretatione but made no effort to integrate them into his syllogistic. Later writers, followed by anon Heiberg, do so, although it is impossible to come away from Barnes’s lucid critical discussion without thinking that he did so ham-fistedly. Indeed Barnes remarks candidly “I conclude that, in the matter of undetermined syllogisms, our text is logically inept” (p. 105); and it is hard to resist that conclusion elsewhere as well. Our author surveys a hotch-potch of later developments (including hypothetical syllogistic, and—perhaps, the text is very unclear—Galenic relational syllogisms), and concludes that, when all allowance has been made for tense, modality, category, and types of negation, there are 2,433,552 valid argument schemes. But here the modalities have been counted twice, and Barnes’ ingenious suggestion for accommodating this (p. 112 n 56) is probably too clever. Barnes’s own discussions of the logical issues raised are invariably interesting and acute; but they are raised, for the most part, precisely because of the ineptitude of the text.

And I’m afraid that, to the extent to which the contributors engage with the philosophical issues themselves rather than merely contenting themselves with historical reconstruction (and this extent varies considerably from scholar to scholar), with the exception of Frede on John they do so in spite of their subject-matter. Thus “Metochites’ Defence of Scepticism”, as recounted by Börje Bydén, seems a poor affair, uninspired by any real knowledge of the Sextan tradition, but (more importantly in my assessment) equally uninspired by any genuine philosophical ability. All that Metochites does (in the early 14th century) is to get hold of a few scraps of sceptical argument preserved in the tradition, and confect an argument for the imperfection of human knowledge (except as regards God and mathematics). Thus he is in some sense the forerunner of the fideistic scepticism of the Reformation and beyond. But like almost all of the subjects of this book, his main concern is theological controversialism, to which philosophy is at best a very poor, secondary cousin.

The same goes for “The Anti-Logical Movement of the Fourteenth Century” discussed by the editor in one of her two pieces (the other, a lucid treatment of “Psellos’ Paraphrasis on Aristotle’s de Interpretatione”, I have no space to consider). The question that concerned the participants in the debate was not what logic was, or how it should be developed, or whether and if so how it is a useful tool in human understanding; the issue is rather: is it Godly? And I find that question of minimal interest. One of the participants in the debate was Barlaam of Calabria (his major opponent being Gregory Palamas); he held that logic was of value not merely in refuting the pagans (so much Palamas allowed: pagan tools can be used against the pagans, just as snake-venom can be used as an antidote), but also in establishing God’s positive qualities. Here too the issue is of enormous theological importance, and had been at least since pseudo-Dionysius; and some interesting philosophizing may be done, inter alia, while debating it (the main point here, however, is the notorious “filioque” clause, and the hopeless wrench it threw in the works of the ecumenical movement of the fourteenth and fifteenth century). But the conclusion is, philosophically at any rate, depressing: Ierodiakonou commends Barlaam over Palamas for superior understanding of Aristotle’s syllogistic; but he lost the debate, being condemned by the Ecumenical Synod of 1341. He returned to Italy, where, as is relatively well known, he tried without much success to teach Petrarch Greek; and he thus holds a place of honour in the early history of renaissance humanism.

Barlaam is one of several figures who crop up in this book of whom non-specialists may have heard mention and may even know something about, usually because of some non-philosophical role they played in the history of their times, often in relation to the west; and it is a pleasant side-effect of reading this book to have one’s limited understanding of them fleshed out by accounts of their intellectual interests. Others in this category include Michael Psellos and Gemistos Plethon, each of whom are the subject of a number of articles. They are treated together in “Psellos and Plethon on the Chaldean Oracles” by Polymnia Athanassiadi; she compares and contrasts their different editorial attitudes to the said oracles, supposed at the time to be of great antiquity, and hence of superior spiritual importance; and she shows how their different editorial principles of inclusion and emendation reflect their rather different intellectual aims, Plethon’s being to use them as a basis for a new syncretic spiritual religion.

Plethon too had connections with the west, being associated with the failed ecumenical council in Florence in 1439-40. Indeed it was there that he both lectured on Plato (helping to spark Florentine neoplatonism), and composed a work against the views of Scholarios, a supporter of Aristotle’s claims to pagan philosophical primacy. Of course the dispute had a religious underpinning, but Plethon’s case is more interesting than most – as a result of his commitment to Plato (and to the Chaldean oracles) he effectively became a pagan himself, and although he died a natural death at a very advanced age around the time of the fall of Constantinople, his works were condemned (by Scholarios, who became the first Patriarch of the church under the Ottomans). Against Scholarios was itself written in response to an attack of Scholarios on an earlier work of Plethon’s (written before he took the name “Plethon”, in conscious, not to say self-conscious, emulation of Plato, in fact) On the Differences between Plato and Aristotle. Plethon (as plain George Gemistos) had argued that the manifest differences between the views of the two great pagans could not simply be interpreted away. Aristotle says the world never began, Plato that it did; Aristotle’s God is not involved in the management of the world, Plato’s is. Thus Plethon takes sides in the revival of a controversy that had obsessed the neoplatonists – can Aristotle and Plato be harmonized? And he answers a resounding “no”. But, as George Karamanolis, in his article on “Plethon and Scholarios on Aristotle” notes, the issue is not simply one of interpetative accuracy: the participants in the debate are concerned with discerning the truth. And on this, Plethon sides with Aristotle (as he interprets him) and against Plato – and Christianity. Here at last (it seems to me) we have philosophy for its own sake (at least as far as Plethon is concerned); but even now, the philosophy is not, to my mind, terribly impressive in its own right, although it is more interesting and important historically (in the context of the story of the revival of Platonism in the west).

Ultimately, then, on the basis of this learned collection, my answer to the question posed at the outset (how important is Byzantine philosophy?) would be: in its own right, not very. There is one substantial article I have not yet touched upon (I exclude Linos Benakis’ none the less useful “Epilogue: Current Research in Byzantine Philosophy” from this category): John Duffy’s “The Lonely Mission of Michael Pellos”, which takes its title form Psellos’ own assessment that “I am a lone philosopher in an age without philosophy” (p. 152). He also claimed that “Philosophy, by the time I came upon it … had already expired, . . /; but I brought it back to life, all by myself” (p. 155). Duffy comments that “Psellos was no stranger to exaggeration … [but] on the issue of philosophy, the evidence suggests that he is telling us nothing but the truth”. To that conclusion, a deflating one for a historian of philosophy at least, I would add that the time of the patient’s coma was a very long one, and that Psellos did not really succeed in resuscitating it. For the most part, the “philosophers” treated in this book are not only unoriginal (that may indeed be a venial sin, if indeed it is a sin at all)—they are uninterestingly unoriginal. But for all that, this is a worthwhile book, and I’m glad I read it –for I would not have come to that conclusion (or at least not on remotely adequate grounds) had I not done so. And negative conclusions may be disappointing -- but, in the humanities no less than in the sciences, they are often very useful.