C. D. Broad's Ontology of Mind

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L. Nathan Oaklander, C. D. Broad's Ontology of Mind, Ontos, 2006, 105pp., $47.95 (hbk), ISBN 3937202978.

Reviewed by Kent Gustavsson, Goteborg University


C. D. Broad's philosophical interests were enormously wide-ranging. He made important contributions to the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of time and causation, the philosophy of probability and induction, the philosophy of religion, the history of philosophy, meta-philosophy and ethics.

Philosophers have long since recognized the importance of his work on the philosophy of time. Happily, there are now signs of a growing interest in his writings on other subjects, such as the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of perception. His dealings with the various issues pertaining to these are characterised by the same thoroughness which characterises all his philosophical writings. Ayer captures Broad's unique philosophical style very well: "The subject is discussed from every angle, the various possibilities judiciously set out, the precedents cited, the fallacious arguments exposed; nothing is skimped: looking for reason we are not fobbed off with rhetoric."

Nathan Oaklander has in his book chosen to focus on Broad's The Mind and Its Place in Nature (MPN). The topics he has selected for examination include what Broad has to say about "such fundamental issues as substance, universals, relations, space, time, and intentionality" (p. ix).

The book contains five chapters. Chapter I, "Propositions and Time," concentrates on his views on these, and how they fit together. Chapter II, "Intentionality and Space in Perception," deals with certain elements in Broad's philosophy of perception. In the third chapter, Oaklander turns to Broad's philosophy of memory. Chapter IV, "Introspection," is concerned with his ontology of relations, which is held to have consequences for his theory of introspection. The last chapter, "Conclusion," reviews the overall results of the previous discussion, and draws further consequences of these results.

Oaklander's book does not lack interesting material. But on the whole it is a huge disappointment, especially considering the standard set by Oaklander's work in the philosophy of time.

Since I shall have to be rather harshly critical it might be fitting to begin with an example where Oaklander comes out well. Broad divides "Reality as a whole" into the part "which exists and the part which is real but not existent" (p. 18, MPN; Broad's italics). Existents are entities which are directly in time. Abstracta are entities which are not directly in time; these entities include "qualities, relations, numbers, and also propositions and classes if there be such entities" (p. 19, MPN). As Oaklander shows, although Broad's initial remarks on propositions are neutral as to their reality he holds them to be real. His notion of a proposition is the traditional one: a proposition is a public and independent "object" of judgments and beliefs; it is the meaning of a sentence, and either true or false. Furthermore, a proposition is timeless because its truth value is unchanging. One of Oaklander's chief claims in the first chapter is that Broad's propositions collapse into particular existents. Two arguments are advanced. He quotes a passage where Broad says that propositions "do not exist (though they may contain existents as constituents); they merely subsist" (p. 18; Oaklander's italics). However, given Broad's views on time, if propositions may contain existents then they themselves become existents and not abstracta.

[P]ropositions which contain existents must become at the time at which the existent they contain becomes. But then such a proposition is no longer an abstractum, i.e., the timeless entity that Broad intends it to be but, rather, itself an existent. (p. 18)

The second argument is the more interesting one. In MPN Broad construes presentness and pastness (though presumably not futurity) as non-relational objective characteristics of events. Oaklander argues that it follows from this that the truth value of (some) propositions change, and that therefore they are not timeless abstracta. Consider the propositions expressed by "this is red" and "this was red", respectively. The first contains the characteristic presentness (Pr), the latter the characteristic pastness (Pt).

Before the single event which allegedly they are both about has become they are both false; at the moment the event becomes the one containing Pr becomes true; the other containing Pt, false; at the next moment and from then on, the latter becomes true, while the former from then on remains false. (p. 24)

This, of course, entails "that either of these propositions, true at one time and false at another, does not have a 'timeless' truth value" (p. 24). So on these grounds too, propositions turn out to be existents and not abstracta, as Broad intends them to be.

Lack of space prevents me from correcting all of Oaklander's errors in his exposition and critique of Broad's theory of perception. I will deal with some of the most serious ones. On careful reflection one will, Broad holds, come up with an analysis of the perceptual situation along roughly the following lines: there is (a) an objective constituent manifesting certain sensible qualities, (b) a subjective constituent, consisting of a mass of bodily feeling, (c) the fact that the objective constituent is intuitively apprehended by the perceiver, and (d) the fact that there are "certain non-inferential beliefs about the objective constituent which go beyond anything that is intuitively apprehended in the situation" (quoted at p. 38).

As is well known, Broad defends a representationalist or sense-datum theory of perception. He argues that the sensuously manifested objective constituent is a sense-datum or sensum, and not, as common sense assumes, a spatio-temporal part of a material object.

The last ingredient, (d), is "the external reference" of the perceptual situation. It is by virtue of its external reference that the perceptual experience has the intentional or, in Broad's terminology, epistemological object it does have.

Now Broad believes that the external reference can be accounted for in terms of bodily feelings: it

consists in the fact that certain specific bodily feelings (connected with the automatic adjustment of the body), certain emotions, and certain feelings of expectation, are related in an unique way to the apprehended sensum. (quoted on p. 39)

When an objective constituent is intuitively apprehended, various traces are excited, which in turn induce "certain bodily adjustments which are accompanied by specific bodily feelings" (ibid).

One may certainly have misgivings about this. Oaklander's criticism of Broad's position is completely misguided, however.

How can one say that the perceptual situation refers to its epistemological object if the very assay proposed for the subjective side either precludes there being a reference, or, if there is one, presupposes what is presumably being accounted for? The mass consists of feelings, emotions, and, presumably expectations. But bodily feelings are non-intentional entities. (p. 41; Oaklander's italics)

True. But Broad's view is not that in a perceptual situation there is a mere assemblage of bodily feeling accompanying the intuitive apprehension of the sensuously manifested constituent: the bodily feelings enter into a unique kind of relation to it. Lest there be any doubt, we may briefly consider Broad's criticism of Russell's theory of perception in The Analysis of Mind (1921). Russell had claimed that the difference between mere sensation and perception simply consists in the fact that in the latter, though not in the former case, a sensum occurs accompanied by bodily feelings (and other sensa).

To this I answer that the blessed word 'accompaniment' tells us nothing. The essential point is, that in the perceptual situation these various factors do not merely coexist, but are related in a perfectly unique kind of whole which we call a 'perception of so-and-so'. (p. 582; emphasis mine)

Broad explicitly argues against the possibility of reducing the perceptual experience to a complex featuring an apprehension of a sensum and a group of bodily feelings accompanying it. The external reference of the experience is in a certain sense linked to these feelings. It is, however, an emergent property of such feelings, i.e. a property which is irreducible to the group though nomologically dependent upon it.[1] That this is Broad's theory is indisputable -- see MPN pp. 578-85 and 638-9! Oaklander's criticism is evidently based on an extremely careless reading of him.

Broad's chapter on perception in MPN starts with an outline of certain elements in the veridical perceptual situation on which everyone can agree, "whatever his philosophical view" (p. 140, MPN). In particular, these are supposed not to involve any departure from the direct realism of common sense. One of the elements is, very roughly, the following: a perceptual situation contains the perceiver and a certain material object, for example, a bell; but the whole bell cannot be a sensuously manifested constituent in the situation, for it is at most only a spatial part and a temporal phase which is so manifested. It is only this spatio-temporal part that is an objective constituent in the situation. (Cf. MPN, pp. 150-1!) Oaklander demurs.

[I]t does not follow from our being unable to see an object before or after we see it that the whole object is not a constituent in the situation in which we see it. It is quite correct to say, at least in veridical situations, that the whole object is intended. (p. 37)

Broad's point is fairly simple. Yet somehow Oaklander completely misses it. Firstly, it does follow that the whole object is not an objective constituent of the situation, because the objective constituent of a perceptual situation is, in Broad's terminology, that which in the situation is sensuously manifested. Temporal phases before and after the present situation are certainly not sensuously manifested. Secondly, it is indeed correct to say that in a veridical situation the whole object is intended. Broad himself would be the first to acknowledge this: by virtue of the external reference the epistemological object of the situation is a whole object (even though, of course, only a spatio-temporal part is a manifested objective constituent in it).

Oaklander also charges Broad with a "scientific bias" which leads him "to take representationalism for granted" (p. 31; my emphasis) -- a serious accusation indeed. He quotes Broad saying that

it is neither necessary nor useful to ascribe to these permanent conditions [i.e. states of physical objects] anything analogous to the colour and temperature which we find in sensa. It has been found more expedient to correlate the colours and temperatures of sensa with certain kinds of motion of certain kinds of microscopic parts of their permanent conditions, … [and] whilst it is not impossible that physical objects may literally have colours and temperatures, there is not the slightest reason to believe that they do. (quoted on p. 33)

This passage embodies a version of the so-called argument from science. However, it is found late in the chapter on perception -- about fifty pages after Broad has carefully endeavoured to delineate and to make the most of the direct realism of common sense. In fact, his willingness to do as much as possible on behalf of common sense should be obvious to the minimally observant reader.

The third chapter focuses on a few select aspects of Broad's philosophy of memory, arguing inter alia that Broad's view "fails because it requires that propositions have a reality which, given his views on time, they cannot have" (p. 57). Oaklander's discussion is on the whole satisfactory. However, there are also flawed elements in it -- again the result of a careless study of Broad's book. Broad distinguishes between two sorts of memory situations, the positive and the negative. The positive is where one simply remembers that, for example, a tie was green. A certain characteristic is then felt to "fit" the object. This characteristic may be presented in various ways, e.g. "by an imitative image, or by actually hearing and understanding the word which stands for it" (quoted by Oaklander, p. 61). In the negative memory situation the characteristic is not felt to fit the object. "The essential point [in memory situations] is the felt fitting or non fitting of suggested characteristics" (quoted, p. 61).

Now Oaklander summarizes this element in Broad's theory as the view that "there is a cognitive relation between general bodily feelings and a present image of some kind" (p. 62; emphasis mine). As one may expect, he repeats his objection from the chapter on perception: "bodily feelings are perfect examples of non-intentional entities" (p. 63). However, when Broad refers to a subject as "having the feeling that this fits or not fits the object," he certainly does not mean that the subject is having a bodily feeling. As a matter of fact, the phrase "bodily feeling" does not occur even once in the chapter on memory! It is therefore simply not true that "the most serious difficulty that Broad faces in memory is the same as the one he faces in perception" (p. 64).

Unfortunately, this is something of a recurrent theme in Oaklander's discussion of Broad. It crops up also in the chapter on introspection. When we introspect our sensing a noise we are aware of our sensing of the noise. What accounts for our introspective awareness? Once again, he erroneously reads Broad as favouring a reductive account in terms of a mass of bodily feelings.

Oaklander is so keen on finding Broad's soft spots that he occasionally lapses into extremely flimsy criticism. Broad divides mental events into two classes, "viz. (i) those which do, and (ii) those which do not have an external reference to an epistemological object" (quoted, p. 79). Oaklander's comment: "Since in Broad's world an epistemological object is literally nothing, the distinction between (i) and (ii) is spurious" (ibid.). Not so. Broad simply avails himself of a certain terminology in order to refer to the intentional content of the experience. When someone is subject to a hallucinatory experience her experience has a certain epistemological object. The object is not a peculiar kind of object, as some philosophers (e.g. Meinong) have claimed -- it is nothing. That her experience nevertheless "has a pink rat as epistemological object" is, in Broad's terminology, elliptical for "her experience represents her environment as featuring a pink rat". This is too obvious to need further remark.

Oaklander ascribes a platonistic theory of universals to Broad. If that is correct, Broad ought to provide an account for "the ontological ground of the connection between a universal and 'its' particulars" (p. 90). Oaklander points to various problems with giving this within Broad's system, and claims that since he cannot account for the connection "Broad's world falls apart" (p. 90; Oaklander's emphasis). Since he attaches so much importance to this it is perhaps worth noting that it is not entirely clear that Broad commits himself to a platonistic theory of universals. He is disposed to do so, but no more:

I am certainly a Realist to the extent of accepting universalia in re as absolutely irreducible factors in Reality. And I am inclined to be a Realist in the stronger sense of believing that we cannot do without universalia ante rem. (p. 20, MPN; Broad's italics)

Apart from that, is it really true that Broad's "world falls apart"? Well, certain parts of his system do, but other parts surely remain intact. This is not the only place in the book where Oaklander seems to labour under the misapprehension that if one particular element in a philosopher's theory of X is flawed it will inevitably wreck everything he has to say on the philosophy of X. Far too many of his eager attempts to demonstrate that Broad's various theories are fatally flawed parallels that of a philosopher who seeks to debunk Frege's semantics by simply noting that Frege is unable to account for the mysterious grasping of Sinn. Needless to say, that is an objection of a kind to be taken lightly.

It is sad to find such a thorough and careful thinker as Broad receiving such a shallow and careless treatment. He surely deserves better![2]

[1] I have dealt with the notion of emergent property and other aspects of Broad's philosophy of mind in my Emergent Consciousness. Themes in C. D. Broad's Philosophy of Mind (Acta Universitatis Gothoburgensis, 2002).

[2] Thanks to Jan Almäng for comments.