C. S. Peirce and the Nested Continua Model of Religious Interpretation

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Gary Slater, C. S. Peirce and the Nested Continua Model of Religious Interpretation, Oxford University Press, 2015, 242pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198753230.

Reviewed by Michael L. Raposa, Lehigh University


Gary Slater has produced a highly original and intellectually sophisticated argument intended to develop resources in Charles S. Peirce's philosophy for the purposes of contemporary philosophical theology. Toward that end, Slater articulates a "nested continua model" for religious interpretation early in the book, one indebted to Peirce's "Existential Graphs," a system of diagrams designed to provide a visual representation of the process of human reasoning. Although it has been the subject of considerable discussion, nevertheless, very few scholars have developed practical applications for Peirce's system of graphs. Peter Ochs is an exception, having adapted Peirce's logic for specifically theological purposes in an important book published in 1998. One of the valuable secondary contributions of Slater's project is his successful attempt to place Ochs' "postliberal" deliberations in productive conversation with Robert Neville's straightforwardly liberal theology. (Along with Robert Corrington and Hermann Deuser, Ochs and Neville have been the most prominent and influential contemporary theological interpreters of Peirce's philosophy.) As a result, Slater is able to formulate a perspective that combines a nuanced historicism with a robust metaphysics -- a combination rare enough to be noteworthy.

The complexities of the nested continua model are unpacked at some length early in the book, initially in the Introduction and then with greater detail toward the end of the first chapter. This model involves the use of inscriptions drawn on a two-dimensional graph, both as specific markings and as a series of concentric circles. On Slater's account, the model can be used in a variety of ways. Inspired by Neville's metaphysical speculations, a point marked at the center of the graph would represent "absolute firstness," the creative source of everything determinate in the universe. Emanating from this point, a series of nested circles can be imagined as portraying realities further and further removed from the act of creation, so that eternity would be represented by the space beyond the outermost circle. Each circle is a continuum, nested within continua of greater generality and "emerging" from those more determinate realities that it enframes. Using the model to illustrate the very different kind of analysis with which Ochs is preoccupied, each circle can also be regarded as supplying an interpretive framework for understanding everything that it contains, even as each framework is itself rendered meaningful by the broader contexts in which it is embedded. Slater observes that any two things that might be distinguished from each other can be marked on the graph as "A" and "B"; any circle drawn around them ("C") signifies a rule of reasoning useful for interpreting these things. "The power of the model," Slater suggests, "consists in its claim that any problem or interpretive framework can be graphed, and that the logical form for doing so -- 'A' relates to 'B' with respect to some 'C' -- remains consistent across all levels of generality" (p. 13).

In the second chapter Slater delineates the intellectual resources from which the nested continua model was developed, most of them Peircean in origin. Some of the difficulty in fully evaluating Slater's project can be linked to certain unresolved problems in Peirce's philosophy. Although Slater's model is inspired by Peirce's Existential Graphs, it should be noted that Peirce began to develop that iconic system of logic only late in his career; when he died this work remained sketchy, the Gamma graphs (devoted to modal logic) having never been completed. Peirce's logical deliberations, moreover, were informed by his study of the topology of Johann Listing, a 19th century mathematician whose approach to the subject differs dramatically from that of later 20th and 21st century topologists. Similarly, Peirce's concept of the infinitesimal, appropriated by Slater for multiple purposes (including his account of how continua emerge one from another), was never fully developed, leaning on the earlier work of his father Benjamin and only vaguely anticipating the way in which this concept would later be employed by Abraham Robinson in his formulation of non-standard analysis (in the 1960's). Surely Peirce's investigations in logic, topology and the mathematics of the infinitesimal must be regarded as unfinished business.

It should be noted that Peirce regarded any two-dimensional graph as being inadequate for the purposes of his modal logic. For the Gamma system, not a single "sheet of assertion," but rather a three-dimensional "book of sheets, tacked together at points" would be required. This conclusion is consistent with Peirce's critique of Josiah Royce's map metaphor, articulated in his review of the latter's Gifford Lectures on The World and the Individual; that map would have to be conceived as only a "section" of some three-dimensional projection. Slater himself recognizes this limitation of his model, admitting that "change itself cannot be rendered on the graph, which is after all a two-dimensional space" (p. 103). His choice is to work within this limitation rather than attempt to develop the model, thus understanding change "in terms of infinitesimal emergence." He further admits that this move involves leaning on a concept of "emergence" that "Peirce himself did not use" (p. 85).

Whatever the limitations of Slater's nested continua model, the ingenuity displayed in his articulation of it is impressive. Moreover, he is careful to modestly circumscribe claims about its potential usefulness, insisting that its employment ought to be understood as only a starting point for any theological inquiry (p. 209). Early on, he describes it as "a kind of abductive Petri dish" for the purpose of testing various theological hypotheses (p. 75). It facilitates a process of experimental thinking and the clarification of vague ideas, especially in the early stages of inquiry. Rather than constituting a full-blown theological method, then, Slater envisions the graphing as playing a key but limited role in such a method.

On my evaluation, the general utility of the model (as with Peirce's existential graphs) consists in its pronounced ability to direct attention for the purpose of making certain inferences (what Slater typically refers to as "willful awareness"), thus displaying the crucial role that attention plays in all forms of human reasoning. (Consider Slater's insightful discussion of "Prescisive and Habit-Conditioned Reasoning" on pages 79-82 -- although I think that Slater conflates "prescision" with "hypostatic abstraction" in a way that he might be more careful to avoid.) The iconic features of the model also enable Slater to avoid the pitfalls of what he refers to as "linguistic determinism" (p. 122); unlike certain contemporary neo-pragmatists, Slater is disinclined to reduce semiosis to language, or limit interpretation to verbal behavior.

With regard to particular uses of the model here, there are also some moments of extraordinary insight, highly original ideas that would be well worth developing. One consists in Slater's use of the nested continua model as an analytical tool to safeguard against metaphysical absolutism or idolatry, playing on the contrast in the model between "translucent" and "opaque" circles of interpretation. Another, toward the end of the book, involves his establishing a link between love and "singular evil" via the Scotistic concept of haecceity (pp. 193-98); since both presuppose an awareness of the radically individual character of things it makes sense on his account to describe such evil as a kind of "love gone wrong." This is nicely done. There are also tantalizing suggestions about a type of "Thirdness" that might be shown to function "as the ultimate logical interpretant with regard to prayer" (p. 157; although the promise to develop this suggestion in a later chapter is only partially redeemed).

However one might evaluate the virtues or shortcomings of Slater's logical model, on my reading, the significance of this book can by no means be reduced to such an evaluation. For example, the discussion and critique of theological supersessionism is thoughtful and illuminating, even while it is not linked closely enough to the nested continua model to demonstrate how or even that the model is required for the purposes of this discussion. Slater's recognition that theological reflection takes multiple forms and so cannot be reduced to a set of responses to problematic beliefs or situations mirrors his nuanced interpretation of Peirce's philosophy. While careful to note that Peirce's full-blown theory of inquiry is capacious enough to embrace both the early "stimulus of doubt" account and the later portrayal of musement, Slater wisely avoids driving any kind of deep wedge between Peirce's initial pragmatism and his eventual "pragmaticism." The summary of key intellectual influences on Peirce's philosophy in the book's first chapter is a model of clarity. And since Peirce wrote very little about the topic, Slater's creative gesturing "Toward a Peircean Philosophy of History" in chapter three deserves careful consideration

As already indicated, Slater's attempt to mediate between the contrasting philosophical and theological perspectives articulated by Ochs and Neville represents a significant achievement. His sensitive reading of these two important but sometimes neglected interpreters of Peirce is scattered throughout the book, but forms the bulk of chapters four and five. Ochs' portrayal of "scriptural reasoning" as an historically conditioned mode of "repair" and Neville's account of all human thought as being intrinsically and essentially "axiological" represent a challenging subject matter rendered lucid by Slater's treatment.

Yet Slater's attention is by no means limited to the work of these two figures. He provides perhaps the most comprehensive overview to date of the scholarly conversation devoted to Peirce's relevance for theology and religious studies. This overview extends back to the pioneering labors of John E. Smith, includes discussion of Corrington's "ecstatic naturalism" as well as my own investigations in "theosemiotic," and then proceeds to incorporate insights gleaned from the work of a small group of younger scholars (such as Leon Niemoczynski, Anette Ejsing, Abraham Robinson and Brandon Daniel-Hughes) who are presently shaping that conversation in new and interesting ways. With the publication of this book, Gary Slater now occupies a prominent place in this latter group. His voice is an original one, his scholarly range impressive (so that his reading of pragmatism registers points of view as disparate as those of Robert Brandom and Sandra Rosenthal). The bold creativity of his model is likely to attract the attention of numerous readers. The insightful application of that model to important issues in the study of religion should both sustain and reward such attention.