Calvinism and the Problem of Evil

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David E. Alexander and Daniel M. Johnson (eds.), Calvinism and the Problem of Evil, Pickwick, 2016, 308pp., $29.60 (pbk), ISBN 9781620325780.

Reviewed by Jerry L. Walls, Houston Baptist University


This book is both brave and bold. It is brave because most of its contributors defend a position that many Christian philosophers think is indefensible and, in fact, makes the problem of evil even worse than it already is. It is bold because the authors put forward a number of interesting proposals in arguing that their position is not only no worse off than other options on the table, but actually better.

The book contains twelve essays and an introduction, and ten of these essays defend Calvinism in one way or another against various forms of the charge that Calvinism exacerbates the problem of evil. In the first essay, Daniel M. Johnson, one of the editors, provides a map of the territory, beginning with an outline of various versions of the first distinctive Calvinist problem of evil, namely, that it makes God the author of sin. Next, he looks at the second distinctive problem, which is how to account for the first sin. Then he turns to the common problem of evil that is shared by all theists, and sketches some responses that Calvinism particularly provides, and he concludes with a brief statement of the "advantages of Calvinism" in dealing with the problem. The essays that follow explore this terrain in more detail. Greg Welty's "Molinist Gunslingers: God and the Authorship of Sin" is an elegantly written and argued case that Molinists face parallel problems in regard to God's responsibility for sin, so they are no better off with regard to this difficulty than their Calvinist counterparts. The next three essays, by Heath White, James E. Bruce, and David E. Alexander, also contend that Calvinism does not make God the author of sin in any objectionable sense. Bruce focuses on the classic Calvinist theologian Francis Turretin. There follows an essay from the noted philosopher Paul Helm, which defends the various ways Calvinists believe God exercises "discrimination" in creation and salvation. In a similar vein, the late Hugh J. McCann explores the issue of grace and free will, particularly in the critical human decision involved in conversion. McCann suggests a sense in which this decision can be a libertarian one within the context of Calvinist theology.

The essay by Alexander R. Pruss is one of two in the volume that is critical of Calvinism. His carefully argued contribution contends that Calvinists face a serious dilemma in accounting for the first sin, whether they opt for the Thomist view that says one's actions are not completely determined by one's character, or the Edwardsean view that says they are. James N. Anderson attempts to deal with the challenge posed by this dilemma in the following essay. The two essays by Christopher R. Green and Matthew J. Hart make the case that there are possible goods that outweigh terrible evils, including, especially in the case of Hart, the evil of eternal hell and the reprobation of many people. The final essay by Anthony Bryson argues that Calvinists should not dismiss the problem of evil too quickly with a "Moorean switch" by resorting to the self-attesting existence of God and the truth of Scripture. Although the author is Reformed, the thrust of the essay is critical of the Calvinist tendency to be apathetic about the challenge posed by evil.

This is an important volume because it represents an impressive attempt to mount a philosophical defense for a position that is more often defended on Biblical grounds than philosophical ones. Indeed, even the proponents of Calvinism sometimes concede that they find their view troubling in various ways, but they insist that they are bound to affirm it because of what they take to be the clear teaching of Scripture. While the authors of this volume seem to share the conviction that Calvinism is the clear teaching of Scripture, their arguments here are distinctly philosophical. Indeed, the final sentence of co-editor Alexander's essay sums up what the volume aims to demonstrate: "Theological determinists can appeal to responses to the problem(s) of evil that are just as sophisticated and prima facie plausible as their indeterminist brothers and sisters" (p. 143).

The volume very much succeeds in showing that Calvinists have some highly sophisticated moves in their arsenal that they can deploy to mitigate the problem of evil. The problem is a hard one that all theists have to face, so Calvinists are hardly alone in having a serious challenge here. But while Calvinists have sophisticated options, it is much less apparent that those options are as "prima facie plausible" as those available to indeterminists, let alone that they are actually preferable.

In the remainder of this review, I want to probe this by focusing on what is often recognized as the most difficult aspect of the problem of evil, namely, the doctrine of hell. And it is easy to see why. Evils of this world, however great they are, may be defeated by the incomparable goods of eternal life and happiness. Commenting on the distribution of evil in this life, Green says: "Unless we know what the future will bring to the individuals involved, we have no basis for saying anything about the ultimate distribution of evils over the entire course of history. We can have no assurance, for instance, that anyone's suffering will be uncompensated" (p 246).

Now the flip side of this is that no matter how fortunate one is in this life, the great evil of eternal damnation will far outweigh any goods one may enjoy. Of this we can be sure: there will be no compensation for the eternal misery of hell. But of course, the obvious objection here is that those who are in hell are only getting what they deserve, so there is no need to compensate their suffering. The particular difficulty the Calvinist faces is how to make sense of this in a world where God determines everything, including the choices of those who end up in hell. The obvious question is why God does not determine all persons to choose the good, and thus avoid not only the evil of this world, but also the evil of eternal misery in hell. Indeed, if compatibilism is true, it seems God could determine all freely to choose the good and avoid hell.

Let us consider how a couple of the authors of this book take on this challenge. First, David Alexander appeals to the privation theory of evil along with the classic notion that God is under no obligation to create anything at all. He writes:

So the badness of hell consists in the absence of something that should be present, most importantly, a right relation to God. As we have also seen, God is under no obligation to create anything at all, even subsequent creation. If that's right, then God is under no obligation to bring about a right relation between creatures and Himself. Hence, hell does not place God's goodness in jeopardy (142).

Alexander goes on to argue that God loves those persons consigned to hell by virtue of the identity of being and goodness, so God's creation and sustaining of the damned is an act of love. Of course, God does not love the damned in the same way he loves the saved, but he still loves them to some degree since he created and sustains them.

Now those who are dubious of Calvinism, or neutral, will not likely find this persuasive. What is at issue here are fundamentally different moral intuitions about the nature of divine goodness as well as how this has been revealed to us in scripture. Even if it granted that, strictly speaking, God has no moral obligations, the question remains whether the account of God's love and goodness suggested here is even remotely satisfactory or true to the Biblical picture of love of God as revealed ultimately in Christ. Would a God of perfect love choose not to bring about a right relationship with himself with some of his human creatures if he could easily do so? Is his love and goodness adequately represented in the very fact that he creates and sustains them in existence, even though that existence takes the form of eternal misery in hell?

Now here Calvinists (including Alexander) often argue that there are other goods that are incompatible with God saving all persons, goods that outweigh saving all persons. One that is often invoked is the good of God's displaying the full range of his wrath in order to fully display his glory. In one of the most fascinating essays in the collection, Hart develops a greater good defense of hell in another direction. As he points out, the good of displaying God's glory would only justify damning, say, several hundred people. But Calvinists have often held that the damned will make up a much larger number, far more than the elect. Hart, drawing inspiration from classical Calvinists like Jonathan Edwards and others, offers an account of possible goods that would require the damnation of many persons.

It is within God's power, he readily grants, "to bring it about that all creatures freely choose him" (252). So why does he not do so? In short, Hart's suggestion is that it is for the sake of the saved that God creates many persons to be damned. It is important to stress that Hart offers his suggestions as "plausibly actual reasons" that God might have (252). This he takes to be stronger than a defense, which is too easy, but short of claiming to know God's actual reasons. Hart develops and defends several such reasons.

To get a sense of the reasons which Hart thinks are plausibly actual, let us consider just one of the goods he thinks might justify God's creating many occupants of hell, namely, the deepened sense of gratitude the saved would have in recognizing the "likelihood of the alternative." When the elect see in hell all their friends and associates who were just like they were in so many ways, they will feel all the more keenly how blessed they are to be saved. This provides a reason why God would determine things so the number of the damned would "far outstrip the elect." Indeed, the more such reprobated companions the elect have, "the more appropriate or 'truer' it will be for them to say, 'I could have been damned,' and their gratitude at being in heaven will increase -- in proportion to both the number of these companions and the similarity of situation of these companions to themselves" (258).

It should be emphasized here that Hart contends God has a loving motive in this scenario because he is acting for the good of the elect as he employs the reprobate in a way that is "useful instrumentally." Nevertheless, Hart is "happy to ascribe to God a non-paternal love for the reprobate (and therefore a desire for the reprobate's good) just so long as it is remembered that familial partialism is going to give God a much greater desire for the elect's good" (269-270).

While we cannot assume all the contributors would subscribe to Hart's claims, I would suggest that his essay epitomizes what is wrong with Calvinism, and accordingly where many readers will not find the arguments of this book finally persuasive. The problem is not a lack of philosophical sophistication, but rather, the dubious, if not highly objectionable claims that are defended with the tools of philosophical analysis. Those not already committed to Calvinism are not likely to find even remotely plausible that the sort of "goods" Hart suggests might provide God with reason to reprobate "far" more persons than he elects to save. Indeed, I am inclined to think God could not even possibly have such reasons, let alone that such reasons are "plausibly actual." Similar problems attend the doctrine of unconditional election period, even if it does not include the claim that God reprobates far more persons than he saves.

This book deserves to be read by anyone interested in Calvinism, including both proponents and critics. The authors have provided a valuable service in both making clear the variety of moves and options Calvinists have at their disposal, as well as bringing into focus many of the most fundamental points of divergence between Calvinists and their opponents. Critics of Calvinism will find especially interesting how this volume displays the radically different judgments about the nature of love and goodness that are at the heart of the debate.