Placeholder book cover

David Sherman, Camus, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 217pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405159319.

Reviewed by Souleymane Bachir Diagne, Columbia University


The last section of the chapter before the "Epilogue" of David Sherman's Camus is titled "Rebirth", an appropriate title for many reasons. First, because the section is devoted to an examination of Albert Camus' last (in fact posthumously published) work, The First Man, a largely autobiographical text which relates the birth and upbringing of the narrator as well as the experience of the pieds-noirs, the European settlers who established themselves in Algeria after 1848, looking for a new life in what became home for them and their descendants. Second, this text was the unfinished manuscript that Camus was carrying with him when his life met its end in a fatal car crash on January 4, 1960. It is difficult not to see in the posthumous publication of the work found on the very site of the crash some form of rebirth of its author, especially because the book turned out to be an important factor in changing the perception many had of Camus as an intellectual who failed to support the Algerian nationalists fighting for their independence. Another Camus scholar, David Carroll, states that The First Man changed his perception of Camus' position on the Algerian war as it did for many others (Albert Camus the Algerian, Columbia UP, 2007). So, indeed, the publication of The First Man does mark a rebirth for its author at a time when the collapse of ideological certitudes means that Camus is no longer persona non grata and can be read afresh as "a philosopher of our times after all" to quote the last words of Sherman's book.

In 1994, the year The First Man was published, five years after the collapse of the Berlin wall, the intellectual world was ready for Albert Camus' rebirth and also ready to reread his work. He had been ostracized and ignored by the intelligentsia on the Left following the publication in 1955 of The Rebel (without being any more palatable to the Right). In the 1980's, the discredit into which Communism had fallen had led to some reconsideration of The Rebel's ethical posture which endorsed neither Capitalism nor Communism. David Sherman rightly states that "in the 1990's a renewed commitment to such cosmopolitan ethico-political concerns as dialogue and human rights" could not but bring back Albert Camus as "a man for our times" since those constitute, ultimately, what he championed as an intellectual and a writer all his life. In 1996 Olivier Todd's monumental biography, Albert Camus, une vie (Gallimard), translated into English the following year (Albert Camus: A Life, Alfred A. Knopf), was another milestone in this comeback. David Sherman's Camus in the Blackwell Great Minds series is certainly a sign that now Albert Camus has found the place he deserves among Western thinkers whose voice our times must hear.

Sherman's book provides an excellent account of Camus' fortunes and misfortunes in the intellectual realm in France immediately following the war. He presents us first with the romantic figure of the handsome Mediterranean philosopher who fought heroically against Nazi occupation and identified himself with Combat, both the name of his cell in the French Resistance and the left-wing journal it clandestinely published and of which he became, in 1944, the editor-in-chief. Jean-Paul Sartre characterized Camus' bravery as a resistant as "not far from being exemplary" (Sherman, p. 178). When Sartre traveled to the United States immediately after the war and was asked about the future of French literature as he saw it, the celebrated existentialist philosopher also announced that the great writer of the future was Albert Camus. So what happened? Why is it that even his Nobel Prize in 1957 somehow further isolated him from where he rightly belonged, with the intelligentsia on the Left?

Sherman explains with great clarity the chronology of facts and events that led to Camus' ostracism. First there is the fact that after the Liberation, Combat quickly became just another commercial paper "within which political and personal tensions grew" (Sherman, p. 16) leading to Camus' resignation from it in 1947. At the end of that same year, La Peste (The Plague) was published. It received bad reviews from many critics, among them Roland Barthes who denounced the lack of a genuine "engagement" and denigrated Camus' choice of chronicle over history and of morality over politics. Barthes' critique foreshadowed the response to the publication, in 1955, of L'homme révolté (Sherman is right to insist that the canonical English translation, The Rebel, is unfortunately titled compared to more accurate alternatives such as Man in Revolt or Revolted Man, p. 138).

In 1956, in Les Temps Modernes, the philosopher Francis Jeanson reviewed the book under the title "Albert Camus or the revolted soul" implying, by that very title, that the author of the book was nothing but what Hegel had characterized as "the Beautiful Soul", a soul incapable of acting (i.e., making a choice) as it remains imprisoned in its own ethical posturing between alternatives that it judges equally bad. Jeanson, a friend of Sartre, essentially concluded that Camus' "vague humanism" amounted to political impotency at a time (that of the post-war polarized world) when clear engagement was needed. Jeanson's hammering of The Rebel was very much in line with Sartre's introduction to the first issue of Les Temps Modernes where he defined what he considered the inescapable responsibility of the writer to choose (the refusal to chose being also a choice). As Sartre famously wrote in that introduction, he considered Flaubert and Goncourt responsible for the repression that followed the Commune because they did not write against it. Camus replied to the review three months later but chose to direct his response at Sartre, the editor, thus relegating Jeanson to the role of a simple spokesperson for the author of Being and Nothingness. When it came to action Camus wrote, among other things, that he did not have any lesson to receive from those who, during the war, had simply "turned their armchair in the direction of history" while he actually fought (Sherman, p. 178). When Sartre replied to this, things just got nastier since he added the charge of philosophical incompetence to the accusation that Camus was ineffectively preaching from some transcendental moral ground. You pretend, said Sartre to Camus, that you criticize a divinization of history by Hegelian and Marxist dialectics while you have read neither Hegel nor me. That was a below-the-belt hit given Camus' distinctive position in the French philosophical scene. It was a way of reminding Camus that his was an atypical trajectory among the caste of French philosophers, most of whom, like Sartre himself, had attended the elite Ecole Normale Supérieure and/or passed the agrégation. Camus had never followed that competitive path, mainly because of his poor health.

After the public break with Sartre, Camus "basically retreated from the political arena" (Sherman, p. 17). Even the Nobel Prize he won in 1957 became evidence that he had been rightly isolated! Because the Nobel committee had praised the then 44 year old writer for his "authentic moral commitment", the French elite suspected that he had been rewarded precisely for his refusal of engagement on the side of those who fought for real freedom. At the time Camus was torn between the two sides on the Algerian war.

Sherman's Camus vindicates the author of The Rebel with respect to the accusations both of "inability to adequately deal with the exigencies of history" (Sherman, p. 191) and of philosophical superficiality. Regarding the latter, Camus has often been dismissed as merely a "philosophe pour classes terminales" (literally a philosopher for senior year of high school), suited for teenagers who become fascinated with the appearance of rebellion that Camus represents, but who take no action.

To the accusation of political paralysis in the face of "the exigencies of history", Sherman's thorough examination of what he calls Camus' "phenomenological ethics" is a particularly enlightening response. With great precision in the reading of the texts, Sherman shows the importance of what he sees as a "socioethical turn", a change in perspective that can be compared to the move made by Kant from The Critique of Pure Reason to the question of morality and action in The Critique of Practical Reason (p. 107). According to Camus, while in theory all human actions are ultimately equivalent in the face of the Absurd, in practice (since the Absurd, contrary to what Caligula tried to do, cannot be "lived") we, as beings sharing the same human condition, discover the "human evidence" that "we must collectively strive for (existential) meaning and happiness" (p. 108). The steep endeavor to follow an ethical path rejecting both values that falsely claim to transcend history and values that divinize history (according to which anything that goes in the direction of history is the right thing to do) is then, by no means, a refusal of engagement. It is the continuous effort of a "moralist" guided by "stubborn humanism, narrow and pure, austere and sensual, waging a dubious battle against [the] events" of particularly troubled times. Those words, written by Sartre in his eulogy to Camus and quoted by Sherman at the beginning of his "Epilogue" (p. 207), are, paradoxically, the best account of what Camus' engagement really was. Paradoxically, because of the accusation of political paralysis that came from the Sartrean camp, but also because the same description of Camus' stature as a moralist could have been used, negatively, to characterize precisely such a paralysis!

"Camus the Algerian" (to paraphrase D. Carroll, Albert Camus the Algerian, Columbia UP, 2007) occupies an important place in Sherman's analysis of Camus' ethics. It is certainly the "battle against the events" of the Algerian war, which Camus felt in such a deep and personal way, as a pied-noir, that was the most "dubious" of all. When he was a journalist writing for Alger Républicain just before World War II, Camus' engagement was clearly on the side of the colonized subjects, those who were called the "Algerian Muslims" or "the Arabs" in opposition to the pieds-noirs who enjoyed French citizenship. Camus called for justice for these people who were treated as outsiders in their own homeland. But after the Algerian war broke out in 1954 and the Front for National Liberation was committed to only one goal, independence, while the colonial administration and its army were left with the alternative of brutal repression or withdrawal, how "narrow" -- to the point of inexistence -- the "pure" path became! Sherman's book shows perfectly how Camus' "stubborn humanism" led him to declare desperately that one should not have to choose between justice and the murder of an innocent victim. (Camus famously considered the possibility that his own mother could be the innocent victim. Even when Camus decided not to speak publicly anymore about "the events of Algeria", he continued to think that one should not have to make the choice between justice and an innocent victim's murder.) Sherman discusses this without falling, as others do, into the inanity of talking about a 'clash of civilizations', and pretending, anachronistically, that today's "age of terror" proves Camus right, in retrospect, when he did not fully embrace the war of liberation as Sartre and the French Left then did.

The ultimate ground upon which commitment rests, for Camus, is sincerity. And "sincerity" is also the word by which, Sherman shows, the question of Camus' philosophical competence is to be answered. Was his account of Hegelian philosophy of history or Marxist historical materialism philosophically accurate when he concluded in The Rebel that they amounted to a "divinization of Man" in the place of the departed God? Sherman himself bluntly recognizes that Camus' reading is simply "not correct" (p. 157). But Sherman also rightly affirms that the limits of Camus' exposition of Hegel's and Marx's philosophies of history do not prevent his fundamental intuition from being true: the "end of history" notion suppresses authentic moral commitment by transferring to an external instance (the concept of what the future will look like) the decision about what values are to be held.

More generally: it is with great precision and clarity that Sherman shows how Camus' writing is a constant refusal, in the name of sincerity, to "ignore reality in favor of the system" (an accusation, though "excessive", as Sherman comments, he made against Marx) (p. 161). In total compliance with Husserl's watchword "to get back to the things themselves", Camus' choice of being a novelist and a playwright rather than a philosopher, his writing, both "austere and sensual", constantly remained true to an authentic phenomenology of human existence and experience. Sherman shows that while Sartre and Heidegger, and before them Husserl himself, made the move towards systematization, Camus stubbornly kept his gaze on lived experience "without raising [his] eyes toward the heaven" of a system (to paraphrase a famous line from The Plague). The philosopher Camus is closer too, in that sense, is Nietzsche, as Sherman repeatedly remarks. We could also point to a similarity between Camus and Pascal, recalling Pascal's famous pensée: "to have no time for philosophy is to be a true philosopher".