Can Animals Be Moral?

Placeholder book cover

Mark Rowlands, Can Animals Be Moral?, Oxford University Press, 2012, 259pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199842001.

Reviewed by Jessica Pierce


The question, 'Can animals be moral?' has suffered the worst kind of philosophical denial: an almost complete lack of interest by "serious" philosophers. This is curious, Mark Rowlands says, because the question is linked to some of philosophy's most persistent obsessions: autonomy, normativity, rationality, motivation, action, and the role of reflective self-awareness and free will in the exercise of morality. It is doubly curious because the empirical data, particularly what scientists have learned over the past two decades about cognition and emotion in a broad range of animal species, are highly suggestive, and moral terminology ("empathy," "fairness," "altruism") is already regularly used in the context of scientific discourse. The scientific body of evidence cries out for attention from philosophers. Should scientists be appropriating the language of morality? Is the use of terms like "empathy" and "fairness" in relation to animals justified, and if so, how does what we are learning about animal behavior alter the way we understand these terms in the human context? Does moral philosophy need some retooling, in light of the empirical data? No matter how skeptical you are about animals and morality, Rowlands would like you to take his question seriously. As anthropologist Claude Lévi-Strauss once suggested, and as Rowlands's book demonstrates, animals are "good for thinking," and even philosophers who have no particular interest in animals will be challenged and provoked by Rowlands's latest contribution to the literature.

In the first chapter Rowlands introduces us to the idea of animal morality by offering a quick sketch of the scientific case for animal moral behavior, focusing especially on early suggestions by Charles Darwin, the work of primatologist Frans de Waal, and my Wild Justice: The Moral Lives of Animals, co-authored with cognitive ethologist Marc Bekoff. Rowlands uses the scientific background to establish animal morality as a serious line of inquiry and to begin structuring the argument of his book. He focuses on evidence showing that animals have what could reasonably be classified as "moral emotions" -- emotions that arise out of concern or solicitude, including compassion, sympathy, grief, empathy, kindness, tolerance -- and that they are sometimes motivated to act on these emotions. This brings us to his thesis and the simple answer to the question in his title: "animals can act morally in the sense that they can act on the basis of moral emotions -- emotions that possess identifiable moral content." (p. 15)

His second chapter is concerned with explaining how, exactly, we ought to understand the attribution of moral emotions to animals. That animals experience emotions is really no longer at issue, at least among scientists who study animal minds. Widespread skepticism does still exist, of course, and is motivated, ironically, by a desire to remain "objective" and to avoid anthropocentrism. But at this point "emotion skepticism" is more akin to "climate skepticism" than to real science. Although Rowlands is not, himself, skeptical about animal emotions, he is nevertheless appropriately cautious: "Whether the attribution of a given emotion to an animal is or is not justified is always an open, and sometimes a deeply complex, empirical question, where theoretical assumptions and confusions can decisively prejudice the conclusions we reach." (p. 12) My own predilection is to turn to the empirical evidence and let this guide the philosophy; Rowlands takes a wholly different approach. He leaves the science behind -- not abandoning it exactly, but not using it to bolster his arguments either -- and focuses exclusively on conceptual issues. Can animals act for moral reasons? The answer to this will come not from accruing more piles of scientific evidence, but rather from understanding how the body of evidence that we already have should be interpreted. And the interpretative act is, at least for the duration of Rowlands's book, philosophical.

Some people would jump to the conclusion that because animals are capable of moral emotions, they are, therefore, moral agents. In chapter 3, Rowlands asks us to separate these two claims: animals can act for moral reasons (on the basis of moral emotions) and not be moral agents, in the sense in which this is normally understood within philosophical circles. In fact, a great deal of his argument centers on showing that animals might inhabit their own category of "moral subjects." A moral subject inhabits the netherworld between moral agent and moral patient; a moral subject can act for moral reasons, but doesn't qualify as an agent. "All moral agents are moral subjects," Rowlands writes, "but not all moral subjects need be moral agents." (p. 33) Animals are clearly moral patients, too (with a moral patient being someone who has interests that should be taken into consideration and who is a legitimate object of moral concern). By defending this tripartite distinction, Rowlands achieves two important goals: he allows that animals lack some of the important components of moral agency, and he removes one of the more dubious implications of the argument that animals act morally: that they ought to be held responsible for their choices. The groundwork has thus been laid.

The next six chapters are the "meat" of the book, beginning first with an overview (chapter 4) of what Rowlands calls the orthodox view of moral action, and, based on this, the standard argument against animal morality: animals may have the rudiments of morality, but they fall short of being really, truly moral because they lack the "stuff" that makes humans moral, with the "stuff" being the kind of cognitive sophistication which allows a creature to reflect upon motives and abstract principles, weigh alternative courses of action, form an impartial perspective, and make a principled choice. But the fact is, says Rowlands, and I agree, none of this "stuff" is essential to acting morally. These capacities may be important elements of some human moral behavior, but behavior can fail to meet these requirements and still qualify as moral.

After characterizing the orthodox view, Rowlands then proceeds, in the following five chapters, to systematically undermine it. To see exactly how he does this, and evaluate whether he succeeds, I'm afraid that you will need to read the book. The arguments are so painstakingly constructed that rendering them in summary form can't do them justice.

One of the most important questions -- philosophically and morally -- is why any of this matters. Rowlands gives us a teaser, in his final chapter, "A Cognitive Ethologist from Mars" (with a nod to Marc Bekoff, whose work on the emotional and moral lives of animals has been important in shaping Rowlands's thought). Although it may not matter to animals themselves whether they have the capacity to act morally, inasmuch as they are not particularly interested in this kind of question, it does matter to animals how we answer the question because it shapes our understanding of what kinds of creatures they are and what kind of relationship we ought to have with them. "If animals can, and sometimes do, act for moral reasons, then they are worthy objects of moral respect." (p. 254)

Unfortunately, this final chapter -- which I found the most rousing -- is only ten pages long, and is framed as a kind of afterthought. Rowlands seems to be moving toward a Nussbaumian capabilities approach toward animal ethics. He says, for example, that treating animals with respect means treating them as more than just receptacles of pain, but respecting them for their natural proclivities, talents, and abilities. This, in turn, means allowing them to live under conditions in which they can flourish, through exercising these natural capabilities and proclivities. (p. 250) "Respecting" animals is more than just a philosophical nicety; it requires that we treat them in ways that affirm their capabilities -- or perhaps more to the point, that we refrain from treating them in ways that constrict or deny who they are. This means, for example, that animals with highly developed prosocial tendencies -- our "moral animals" -- cannot flourish if we remove them from their social communities (this is my example, not Rowlands's). I hope that Rowlands is writing another book that takes off where this final chapter begins.

Can Animals Be Moral? is dense and full of technical language -- and this is necessary to Rowlands's task, as I understand it: to convince an otherwise skeptical audience of philosophers that animal morality is serious business. Philosophers will appreciate the carefulness of Rowlands's arguments, the clarity of his writing, and his understated sense of humor. "Normal" people (people without advanced degrees in philosophy), on the other hand, will have to be very dedicated to make their way through the monograph. Rowlands has written a few excellent short pieces which aim at greater accessibility; I hope he continues to translate the material from this book for a general audience because people are very interested in these questions -- as the broad success of DeWaal's and Bekoff's work attests -- and they want help thinking through the philosophical and, especially, the practical implications of what we have learned about animals over the past two decades.

One thing is oddly absent in Rowlands's book: animals. I understand why Rowlands didn't include more discussion about animals themselves -- he was focusing on philosophical arguments. But it also struck me as odd, because it is when we really look at animals that philosophical and cultural stereotypes start to break down. I challenge any skeptic to spend a few weeks immersed in the now extensive literature on animal cognition, emotion, and prosocial behavior -- and then spend a couple of weeks in the company of animals -- and still come away with a sense that they are less sensitive, less intelligent, less socially attuned than humans. Our skeptic will certainly come away thinking that animals can't do everything we do -- they can't do philosophy, for example (though I suspect they would say, "who cares?"). But she will also come away with a new appreciation of our own limited capacities and a new respect for other forms of life -- including, I would think, a sense that our wanton cruelty and disregard for others' lives and feelings is just plain wrong.

During the time I was reading Rowlands book, I watched the documentary film Blackfish. The narrative centers on a bull orca named Tilikum, who has been held in captivity for over three decades, and now performs at Sea World Orlando. Blackfish can serve as a case study of how the attribution of particular capacities to animals compels changes in our relations to them. The capacity of orcas to experience complex emotions and to act as moral subjects, in Rowlands's terms, is fairly well-established scientifically. The film interweaves scientific information about the lives of wild orcas with a recounting of the horrors that Tilikum has suffered, and continues to suffer, in the name of entertainment and economic profit. It is very hard to watch this film and not be changed by it, and the public response to the film bears this out. People describe a kind of gestalt shift. Sea World is no longer a place of laughter and fun; it is barbaric. Many people who would have once enjoyed a trip to Sea World with their children now say they will never step foot inside an entertainment-oriented aquarium again. Blackfish shows us Tilikum not as an abstraction but as a real "person" who has suffered profound emotional and physical mistreatment. Blackfish also sheds a rather hazy light on Rowlands's claim that "naturally, humans have a moral consciousness unrivalled by other creatures."

There are very strong incentives for failing to take animals seriously. But we are culpable for willful ignorance and misunderstanding and "skepticism" about animal emotions. And this is where I found myself impatient with Rowlands's project: it underplays the urgency of these questions, the urgency of upsetting the orthodoxy and, as Rowlands says, "loosening the grip of normativity" -- because these contribute to our failure to really see animals for who they are. Really, do we need to torture ourselves with these arguments when the path forward is so clear? I suspect the answer is "yes": philosophers want to be tortured with the arguments -- they need to feel convinced of the soundness of the claims being made. (They may also want to keep eating their steak.) Read this book, read some of the substantial scientific literature about animals and emotions, be convinced. Quickly. And then let's move on and start changing our individual and cultural practices toward animals and start showing them some real moral respect.