Can God Be Free?

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William Rowe, Can God Be Free?, Oxford University Press, 2004, 184pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198250452.

Reviewed by Timothy O'Connor, Indiana University


Consider the idea of God in classical philosophical theology. God is a personal being perfect in every way: absolutely independent of everything, such that nothing exists apart from God’s willing it to be so; unlimited in power and knowledge; perfectly blissful, lacking in nothing needed or desired; morally perfect. If such a being were to create, on what basis would He choose? Let us assume (as perfect-being theologians generally do) that there is an objective, degreed property of intrinsic goodness, such that every possible object is intrinsically good to some degree. We need not assume that this property is ‘well ordered’ in the sense that every object is comparable to every other, only that it is ‘partially ordered’ in the sense that every object belongs to one or another well-ordered set of objects and has less goodness than God Himself. We thus replace the image of a linear ‘great chain of being’ with that of a branching structure whose branches reconnect only at their limit, which is God. And let us further suppose that whole systems of objects and their total histories — possible worlds — are likewise partially ordered by their intrinsic goodness. Now, if one or more of these creative options on each of the branches are of maximal overall value, is it inevitable that He would choose one of those? It seems passing strange that God would opt for less than the best when creating the best involves no cost at all. Yet supposing the choice of the best is inevitable for a perfect Creator seems at odds with the common assumption that God is perfectly free in choosing what He will. Perhaps, though, there is no set of one or more best creative choices. For every option, there is a better, with no finite upper bound on the ranked series. Here, matters are more puzzling. It appears that no matter which option God might choose, He must do so in the knowledge that there are options of arbitrarily greater value. It seems an odd constraint for a perfect being to have to live with. And while we engage in such musings, we might wonder why, given his supreme perfection and contentedness, God would create anything at all? Such puzzles are the focus of William Rowe’s Can God Be Free? While considering a variety of wrinkles along the way from both historical and contemporary philosophers, Rowe maintains throughout that a simple line of reflection remains compelling. Its conclusion is that a perfect Creator cannot but choose the best. Therefore, the theist must either suppose (implausibly) that there is a best of all possible worlds, one that has been unfreely selected by God, or abandon the claim that there is a perfect Creator.

Rowe devotes the first half of his book to an assessment of the pertinent views of four significant thinkers from the past. He begins with Leibniz, who of course maintained that there is a best possible world and that God has certainly chosen to create it. Rowe agrees with Leibniz’s principle that one who produces an outcome less good than that which he is able to produce must himself be less than perfectly good. However, he also agrees with the many commentators since who have believed that Leibniz failed to reconcile this thesis and the assumption that God is essentially good with the claim that God’s choice of the best nonetheless is not absolutely necessary. Leibniz’s correspondent Samuel Clarke agreed that this is the best of all possible worlds, but he held an indeterministic conception of freedom of the will (for both divine and human agents). His attempt to reconcile God’s absolute freedom with the certainty of His choosing the best turned on a distinction between ‘physical’ and ‘moral’ necessity. Given God’s unchangeable character, His choice of our world is morally necessitated in that it is inconceivable that God should fail to choose the best. But because God has the power to bring about a lesser world and requires no external condition to activate this power, His choice is not physically necessitated. And moral necessity is consistent with the perfect freedom of His will, since nothing — not even God’s belief that this world is best and resolute commitment to attaining the best — causes His choice, which is instead the product solely of His active power. In reply, Rowe argues that Clarke’s focus on the notion of physical necessity obscures the crucial matter, which is that the logic of Clarke’s own position commits him to the conclusion that God could not have caused Himself to have made a different choice, and that this result is inconsistent with God’s choosing freely.

Rowe then turns to the views of Thomas Aquinas. He endorses Norman Kretzmann’s argument that some aspects of Aquinas’s thought pull strongly towards the conclusion (in fact resisted by Aquinas) that God was not free not to create anything. Rowe also casts doubt on Aquinas’s reasons for denying that there is a best possible world for God to create while conceding that the opposing contention is similarly in doubt. Finally, Rowe applauds Jonathan Edwards’ charge that his theological opponents are inconsistent in maintaining that human responsibility requires that we are able to not to will as we do while God is perfectly responsible and praiseworthy even though He necessarily wills that which He deems to be best.

In the second half of the book, Rowe narrows the focus onto a single thesis: a perfectly good God necessarily would create the best world that He can. As he notes, if we accept this thesis as well as God’s existence, it follows that there is a best possible world (or equally good set of worlds) and that God has created it (or one of them). He then proceeds to defend this thesis against a number of contemporary challenges to it, beginning with Robert Adams’ argument that there is no moral obligation to create the best and that a choice of less than the best can be adequately accounted for in terms of divine grace, a disposition to love independent of the value or merit of that which is loved (83). Rowe counters that perfect goodness is not a function simply of meeting one’s obligations: it also reflects the disposition to achieve as much good as one can. God’s being both perfectly good in this manner and also gracious in His attitudes towards imperfect creatures are not inconsistent; they merely entail that His creative choice would be motivated by something other than love alone. (And what is a more natural candidate motivation than a desire for the best?)

But what if choosing the best is not an option? Perhaps for every world, there is a better one. If that is so (and Rowe concedes that it well might be), it seems one could hardly fault God for choosing some very good world or other. Rowe, however, demurs, on the basis of the following claim:

If an omniscient being creates a world when there is a better world that it could have created, then it is possible that there exists a being morally better than it. (112)

Clearly, a perfectly good being would reject worlds that are on balance bad. But where would He set the minimum? Rowe thinks it evident that, other things being equal, a being whose minimum standards are higher than another’s is a better being. Imagine a good, omniscient, and omnipotent creative being faced with a series of increasingly good possible worlds whose value has no upper bound. Being good, it wants to create something, and something very good. Perhaps it has to resort in the end to some arbitrary procedure for settling upon a particular world, subject to the constraint imposed by its judgment about an acceptable minimum level of goodness, n. Now imagine another being just like the first but for whom the minimum acceptable value in a world is twice n. Rowe believes it is clear that this second being is better, in virtue of its higher standards (95). Some will reply that this result is absurd in the context of options with no upper limit of value, since whatever standard such a being sets, there will be an arbitrarily higher one it might have set. How can one be faulted for failing to achieve the best if doing so is impossible?

However, we need to be careful here, says Rowe. We must distinguish three claims:

(a) Failing to do the best one can is a defect only if doing the best one can is possible for one to do.

(b) Failing to do better than one did is a defect only if doing better than one did is possible for one to do.

© Failing to do better than one did is a defect only if doing the best one can is possible for one to do.

While (a) and (b) are true, Rowe argues that © is not. Otherwise, we should have to suppose that a being that created a world that was just barely good on balance might be wholly above reproach. However one judges Rowe’s fundamental intuition, this buttressing argument is less than compelling. Might not one coherently suppose that goodness entails the creation of a world that is very good, on balance, while denying that degree of goodness in general is a function of the degree of goodness one is willing to settle for, given that one is inevitably going to have to settle for something sub-optimal?

It may strike some readers as bizarre to suppose with Rowe that facts about the structure of possibility space have direct implications concerning the possibility of an infinitely perfect being. Rowe’s response is to argue that we cannot take it as axiomatic that the notion of an absolutely perfect being is a coherent one. Although some challenges to this notion’s coherence are purely internal ones, others concern the very possibility of certain omni-attributes, given seeming facts about the structure of facts over which the attributes range (e.g., omniscience and the structure of knowable facts). And since it is less than evident whether or not there is a best possible world, one who is committed to the possible existence of a perfect being may infer that there is, after all, a best possible world.

What are we to make of the issue Rowe presses? One needn’t agree with Rowe that moral goodness necessarily tracks one’s minimum standard for result acceptability in order to deem unsatisfactory, or at least highly peculiar, the picture of God arbitrarily selecting one very good option, at the price of rejecting an infinity of alternatives which are of surpassingly greater value. It suggests an inevitable frustration of what, goodness aside, looks to be a natural aspiration (overall value maximization) of a perfect Creator. And yet the claim that our universe is a prominent component of this world’s being the best of all possible worlds seems unduly bold. So the philosophical theologian will naturally seek a different way of framing the matter, one which may lend itself to another, better option. I suggest we start by questioning the common assumption that in deciding what to create, God contemplates possible worlds, conceived in the usual way as maximal states of affairs. Note that God doesn’t create worlds (as Rowe himself notes, 40, 77), but concrete totalities such as physical universes. And if some of these totalities will contain indeterministic processes, then plausibly God could not know which particular world would be actualized as a result of His creative activity. God’s concern might focus accordingly on the degree of goodness of the indeterministic universe-type that His activity directly ensures, independent of the particulars of how this is realized in its details.

Now, although there can be but one actual world, there is no reason to suppose that God would limit himself to creating just one universe. Let us say that a ‘super-universe’ is a collection of one or more totalities that are mutually disconnected save for their common origin within God’s creative choice. Clearly, God’s creative choice concerned which super-universe to create. It is plausible that for every single universe God might create, there is a better, where the goodness in question is not merely aggregative, but organic (Rowe, 78). So, if God restricted his consideration to single-membered super-universes, He’d be stuck with a sub-optimal outcome, no matter what He did. However, prospects appear to improve were He instead to contemplate infinitely-membered super-universes, where the constituent universes are ordered by their organic goodness without a finite upper bound on the series. In choosing such a super-universe, it is not true that there is some arbitrary limit on the goodness of universes God creates. As for the entire super-universe, there will be infinite aggregate value, while the concept of organic goodness seems inapplicable, given the disconnectedness of the individual members. It is not obvious that a perfect being’s concern would extend beyond attaining maximal organic value to likewise maximizing the merely aggregate goodness over universes, which are disconnected totalities. (At least, this should not seem obvious to one who does not also endorse a principle of plenitude, holding that goodness would seek to maximize the number of good things.) But supposing that its concern does so extend, one will then suppose that God would opt for a reality of unlimited aggregate goodness. Would the collection of such universes be measured by a particular infinite cardinal, corresponding to some intrinsic limit? Or might it, more radically, encompass a proper class of universes, one which has no measure at all? We cannot explore these matters here. Whichever way we go on the relevance of aggregate value to God’s creative choice, it seems the theist has reason to believe that there are at least aleph-null universes.

To this, Rowe will have two retorts. First, he will contend that one who embraces the final option of supposing that God will maximize aggregate value is endorsing, in the end, the Leibnizian claim that this is the best (or one of infinitely many equally best) of all possible worlds, and this is incredible. (The goodness of the possible world that is actualized through the creation of a super-universe will roughly correspond to the latter’s aggregate goodness.) I reply that once we recognize that this implies nothing about the organic goodness of our particular universe, we should regard the judgment of its incredibility as totally unfounded. Second, Rowe might say, you must at least concede my contention that taking this route implies that God was not free in Creation. We may observe that the view I have suggested is consistent with infinitely many satisfactory choices among super-universes. But the better reply, which I haven’t space to develop here, is to challenge Rowe’s assumption (64) that freedom in God and human beings are identically realized. To choose freely (in the metaphysical sense) is for one to be the ultimate origin of one’s choice. For any created being, this is possible only if there are significantly different alternative choices that one might have made. No such implication holds, however, for the causally unconditioned, self-existing perfection which is God.