Capabilities in a Just Society: A Theory of Navigational Agency

Placeholder book cover

Rutger Claassen, Capabilities in a Just Society: A Theory of Navigational Agency, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 264pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108473262.

Reviewed by Morten Ebbe Juul Nielsen, Copenhagen University


This well-argued and thought-provoking book will be of particular interest to philosophers working in the fields of social or political justice, the capability approach (whether pro or contra), political liberalism or public reason, and the perfectionism/neutrality and liberal/communitarian discussions.

Rutger Claassen aims to develop an account of political justice situated in the capability approach but more sensitive to the aims and values of liberalism than the standard capability approach. He characterizes his position as "moderately perfectionist liberal" -- less perfectionist than Martha Nussbaum's influential account, but more perfectionist than (e.g., Rawlsian) political liberalism. Roughly, Claassen endorses perfectionism insofar as the values of freedom and autonomy are built into the core of his theory of justice; this makes the project different to neutralist political liberalism. However, the theory also advocates a sort of "second level" neutrality: neutrality vis-à-vis other values is mandated and justified by an appeal to respect for the autonomy of persons; and the state should not (directly) try to promote, in the vein of Raz, a plurality of good or worthwhile options (pp.20f.)

One great attraction of Claassen's project is that it emphasises a distinctively liberal ideal, which can be expressed as follows: against non-liberal theories, liberalism stresses that persons ought to have the possibility to freely navigate between (or have a fair chance to reform) given social practices. This is the "navigational agency" central to Claassen's theory. The possibility is to move between, e.g., cultural practices, leaving one practice altogether, or to have a fair opportunity to change a practice is quintessentially a liberal ideal, and is, perhaps, an ideal that is not stressed enough in recent writings on social and political justice. Certain capabilities are needed to protect or promote navigational agency: capabilities of empowerment (e.g., civil liberties), of subsistence, and of political participation.

The capability approach, as originally championed by Nussbaum and Amartya Sen, has proliferated into several different theories and approaches, including less philosophical and more concrete programs in the social sciences. The capability approach as a philosophical contribution to the discussion of justice can be defined by two claims: real freedom to achieve well-being is normatively of first importance, and this freedom should be understood as "capabilities"; persons' "opportunities to do and be what they have reason to value."[1] Claassen's theory supports such a philosophical project: it aims to defend a distinct and rather comprehensive theory of (political) justice, albeit not a complete moral theory. This review will therefore focus on the main philosophical issues raised by Claassen and only to a very minor extent on its practical implications.

The book begins with an internecine battle between Claassen and Nussbaum. The gist of Claassen's critique is that even the more recent "politically liberal" Nussbaum fails to be adequately non-perfectionist in substance: while Nussbaum may profess a method of overlapping consensus, the actual theory remains too perfectionist and exclusive. This section is probably of great interest to those interested in the exact formulation of a capability approach. In any event, Claassen's main aim here is to carve out a middle position between, on the one hand, (various forms of) "hard liberal perfectionism" and liberal neutralism or political liberalism (in the vein of thinkers such as Rawls, and Larmore) on the other hand. The result is Claassen's "moderate perfectionist liberalism." This position does use references to the good in its justification, namely autonomy and freedom, and it explicitly aims to promote freedom and autonomy. This is, naturally, the perfectionist side of the position. It is tempered, according to Claassen, by incorporating into the position a more modest form of neutrality, a neutrality of abstinence. While the justificatory rationale remains non-neutral, the theory does not aim to promote any more specific values, conceptions of the good, or ways of life. This is a contrast to, e.g., Joseph Raz's classic conception of perfectionist liberalism, where the state should (or at the very least could) promote some ways of life that are deemed to be valuable.

This raises some questions. One is whether Claassen's classification -- ranging from neutralism/political liberalism as the least perfectionist theory on one end of the spectrum to non-liberal perfectionism on the other (see p.19) -- really captures the core of the debate. One form of neutralism, Ronald Dworkin's, could be said to be based on a conception of the good (autonomy or the life lead from the inside). Other forms of liberalism, Gerald Gaus's for instance, could be said to be vehemently opposed to using conceptions of the good as justificatory material without the consent of the public, at least as a rule of thumb, but could (given contingent convergence of the public's attitude about specific rules) converge on justifying policies that promote all sorts of values. The question is whether the chasm between political liberalism and Claassen's moderate perfectionism is very deep, or whether the difference is primarily verbal.

In a sense, Claassen aims to reconcile political liberalism and its accompanying ideal of neutrality of justification and (moderate) liberal perfectionism. Another project of reconciliation concerns the communitarian/liberal divide. Claassen's theory of navigational agency tries to incorporate the best of two worlds, as it were: citizens are embedded or participate in specific social practices. They need participatory capabilities or competences/opportunities to do so. This may be called soft communitarianism: social embeddedness is both inevitable and desirable. However, and this is the liberal counterbalance and, perhaps, the main take home message of Claassen's project, citizens should also have navigational capabilities, competences and real opportunities to move between or to and from specific social practices, or to have a fair chance of reforming existing practices. Stressing the navigational aspect of the capability approach is not entirely new. Elizabeth Anderson's seminal "What's the Point of Equality" mentions that persons should have the right to "whatever capabilities are necessary to enable them to avoid or escape entanglement in oppressive social relationships" (Ethics 109 (2):287-337 (1999), p.316). Claassen could be said to elaborate on exactly this point.

This discussion reminds us of the controversy over exit rights with key players such as Susan Moller Okin, Chandran Kukathas and Will Kymlicka. The result of Claassen's dual-theory of agency -- our agency to operate in but also move between concrete social practices -- may either be called soft communitarianism, or liberalism with an eye to the "social thesis" (Kymlicka), and in that sense it may seem to be overselling its novelty. Some readers may think that this discussion is a bit of an old hat. Communitarianism in its more extreme forms is unattractive due to the denial of robust individual rights as guards against cultural conventionalist repression and the underlying relativism of the theory, and political theorists (including many of those associated with communitarianism) have generally accepted this. Liberals have long acknowledged that any simplistic, "atomistic" conception of the individual as somehow pre-socially formed, independently of practice, culture, etc., is untenable and false. Liberals also accept "the social thesis" that individuals are metaphysically speaking social beings, but are generally not prepared to draw any strong moral conclusions from that fact. This could be summed up in the slogan "metaphysically social, morally individual".

This dual theory of agency -- embedded participatory and autonomous navigational agency -- is supposed to be rooted in a transcendental argument that occupies much of Chapter 3. One may accept the social thesis: agents are necessarily (whatever one intends with "necessarily") social beings, without taking any further step to navigational agency and hence freedom and autonomy. Claassen needs to show that we cannot -- or ought not? -- settle with "mere-participational agency". To this effect, it is claimed that "all rational mere-participational agents must upon reflection necessarily understand themselves as navigational agents instead -- hence, claim rights to navigational agency as well" (p.86). This is to cut a quite long and complicated story short, but I believe this is the key point of the argument. It is probably also the point that will attract most criticism or skepticism: why exactly is it that "mere-participation agents" by necessity must come to see themselves as navigational? However, it may be said in Claassen's defense (albeit a defense that Claassen may find unsatisfactory given his aim to present a rationally compelling transcendental argument) that his dual agency theory is normatively attractive, whether or not some transcendental argument can be mustered to buttress it. To view agents as inescapably locked in their present social or cultural actuality just is to deny them what must be a central concern for any liberal -- or simply humane -- theory of justice: their capacity to form, revise, and to rationally pursue their own conception of the good, and not just to adopt such a conception thrusted upon them from outside forces. Stressing navigational agency fulfills this purpose, and is one of the strong points of Claassen's book.

Claassen moves on to sketch the distributional implications of the combination of the dual theory of agency and the capability approach. In essence, Claassen retains a commitment to a soft and qualified form of sufficientarianism. The threshold is defined by what capabilities are necessary for a given individual to develop navigational agency. To avoid reasonable criticism about threshold fetishism (i.e., favoring small gains to bring someone just to or over the threshold rather than larger gains for persons worse off), prioritarianism is incorporated as a principle for distributions below the threshold. Moreover, we should aim for equality when positional goods (goods whose value depends only on their relative distribution in a population) are at stake. This entails that levelling down (as regards positional goods) may be preferable if uneven distribution of positional goods undermines the development of navigational agency. All this should be further tempered by a luck egalitarian principle of responsibility, at least "where choice is needed to develop agency" or when "more agency development can be realized by spending resources on others who do cooperate" (p.8, p.133, see pp.193-131 for the entire argument).

This is rather tricky stuff, and some may complain that this part of the construction appears somewhat ad hoc. Against this, why insist that something as complicated as distributive justice must be reduced to one and only one principle, or that this principle should be triggered by just one underlying intuition? Still, Claassen states that "these complications are not arbitrary concessions to the sufficientarian's opponents, but . . . have all been shown to arise out of sustained reflection about the nature of my metric (agency-enhancing capabilities) itself" (p.131). But surely we don't care only about agency-enhancing capabilities. Sometimes we care simply about human suffering and misery, whether or not this relates to agency (even if suffering often undermines full agency). This complaint is (partially, at least) addressed in Chapter 6, on "subsistence capabilities", but the focus on agency is still maintained; whether or not this inflates the value of agency depends of course on whether, or to what extent, one believes that capabilities are the best or only relevant metric.

The third and last part of the book proper (there are three appendixes) consists of -- in addition to Chapter 6 --  Chapters 5 on "empowerment capabilities" (that also includes a very interesting section on paternalism) and 7 on "political capabilities". These three sets of capabilities are proposed as those necessary for the development of navigational agency. More specifically (this list is not exhaustive), this consists of items such as education and the main civil liberties; basic health, housing and nourishment (whose just distribution implies redistribution of wealth that goes beyond the subsistence level); and capabilities of (political) participation and legal standing. Chapter 7 also includes interesting discussions about democracy, and about political communities in a global light.

Trying to sketch a theory of political justice in just over 200 pages naturally leaves many flanks open to attack. In the conclusion, Claassen points to three. Roughly: how should trade-offs between capabilities be handled; what about future generations, marginal agents and people living in other political communities; and, finally, the question about the completeness of the theory.

If navigational agency should be central to (or at least at the center of) our discussion of political justice, one important question we would have to face is distributional: who should get what to promote or secure navigational agency, and from whom? Claassen is therefore right that we need a compelling distributional theory to go hand in hand with a theory of navigational agency. Claassen's offer is a complex sufficientarianism tempered by prioritarian, egalitarian and luck egalitarian elements. The intuitive appeal of sufficientarianism is, it may be held, that as concerns many goods having enough seems to satisfy justice. You need navigational agency, not super-navigational agency, in order to exercise autonomy to a degree satisfying the demands of justice. More modestly, one may say that giving people enough (we may here speak of several rather than one threshold: e.g., enough to survive; enough to be able to learn to read; enough to be able to form and revise a conception of the good) must have priority before other concerns should occupy us, such as addressing the inequalities between the well-off and the very well-off. In any event, Claassen's complex distributional theory is thought-provoking and deserves further scrutiny.

Placing the theory of navigational agency in between liberal neutralism and full-blown liberal perfectionism naturally makes the theory vulnerable on both sides. Liberal perfectionists could ask why other robust values apart from freedom and autonomy may not be promoted. After all, the autonomous person may find herself bereft of valuable opportunities in which to exercise autonomy, at least in principle. Moreover, it may be claimed that a truly liberal form of perfectionism will pay enough respect to the core values of freedom and autonomy, so promoting other values would not compromise the liberal core. From the other side, public reason liberals and other neutralists can muster a rather impressive arsenal of both instrumental arguments against perfectionism (e.g., fear of letting states promote a controversial ideal of autonomy) and intrinsic ones (e.g., arguments to the effect that, ultimately, relying on controversial ideals about autonomy, or a controversial list of capabilities-to-be-promoted is, ultimately, incompatible with equal respect for citizens). Be that as it may, Claassen's scholarly contribution to the debate is a highly recommended addition to the liberal-capacitarian debate which has occupied political theorists over the past twenty years.

[1] Robeyns, Ingrid, "The Capability Approach", Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, paragraph 1, accessed 02-04-2019.