Capitalism, For and Against: A Feminist Debate

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Ann E. Cudd and Nancy Holmstrom, Capitalism, For and Against: A Feminist Debate, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 350pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521132114.

Reviewed by Jonathan Wolff, University College London


In 1923, the British House of Commons had what was termed "a great debate": "Socialism or Capitalism: Which?" Not so long ago, books were regularly published on this thorny topic; but now, even on the left, enthusiasm for raising the issue has waned. One could cite many causes for socialism's submergence, but among academics a key moment was the publication, in 1983, of Alec Nove's The Economics of Feasible Socialism.[1] Nove, a respected economic historian of the Soviet Union, reported the depressing details of failure after failure of communist economies, often able to function only because of extensive illegal black markets. The only hope he saw was for a form of market socialism. And that source of optimism became rather more muted, allowing for a mix of state, co-operative and private enterprise, by the time of Nove's publication of a revised edition, entitled The Economics of Feasible Socialism Revisited, in 1991.[2]

From the 1990s on, most commentators on the left have accepted that we simply do not know how to organise large-scale economic systems without a very significant role for the market to convey information and, somewhat more controversially, to provide incentives for individuals to act on that information. The challenge has been to show how markets can be combined with non-capitalist forms of organisation. And little here has been found generally convincing.

Against this background it is immensely refreshing to receive a volume called Capitalism, For and Against: A Feminist Debate, by Ann Cudd (for) and Nancy Holmstrom (against), both of whom have written extensively on related topics. The immediate context is the global economic crisis that started in 2009 and as I write shows little sign of lifting. While the context may be new, the issues are not, and the lively and well-written contributions draw on and deploy many arguments and distinctions familiar within contemporary political philosophy, set out in a pleasingly non-technical fashion. Hence this book could serve as an introduction to a range of contemporary debates, not only concerning the definition and fortunes of capitalism, but also the analysis of freedom, the justification of private property, and the difficulties of collective rationality, among other key issues. The book follows the standard format for the Cambridge University Press 'For and Against' series in which it features: each author presents their argument independently, and then replies to the other's contribution.

The central question of whether capitalism is good or bad for women will depend, naturally enough, on what is meant by capitalism, what it is being compared to, and how the comparison is to be made. None of these is obvious, and it is not a surprise that the authors approach the questions in a different way. Cudd suggests that capitalism as a 'descriptive ideal' must meet the following conditions:

1.     Private ownership of capital

2.     Free and open decentralized markets

3.     Free wage labour

4.     Non-discrimination (pp. 6-22)

There are two oddities here. Holmstrom, reasonably enough, takes issue with the last condition. Non-discrimination is often argued to be a beneficial consequence of capitalism, on the grounds that discrimination is costly for the discriminator. Of course there are arguments the other way -- prejudiced consumers may take their custom elsewhere -- but rather than allowing the positive claim to go forward for evaluation, Cudd makes it true by definition. (Cudd 105-6) But this, as Holmstrom points out, will have odd consequences. As she writes, 'Did the United States become capitalist only in 1965 with the passage of the Civil Rights Act?' (p. 292) And by this standard Saudi Arabia is considered non-capitalist; especially convenient for those who want to defend capitalism's feminist credentials, but a highly controversial move.

The second oddity in Cudd's definition is its failure to mention profit as a defining feature of capitalism. Karl Marx took pains to distinguish market society, including 'simple commodity production', in which individuals trade their surplus products, from capitalism proper, in which trade and production were undertaken for the sake of turning a profit and subsequent capital accumulation. Cudd of course recognises that capitalism is driven by the search for wealth (p. 81), yet at some points she seems to suggest that profit is a relatively incidental aspect of capitalism (p. 280). Certainly in abstract models of capitalism, under conditions of perfect competition, there is no profit. But this is why -- whatever they say in interviews -- capitalist business people hate competition. Companies do their best to differentiate their products from their competitors and big companies buy out small competitors if they become a threat. Cudd, quite bizarrely to my mind, attempts to run an analogy between the joys of competitive sport and the joys of competitive business (pp. 280-1). It may be true that for some thrusting chief executives the spice of competition gets them get out of bed in the morning with a spring in their step, but for their shareholders a comfortable monopoly is much better for maximising returns and reducing risk.

Holmstrom adopts a definition of capitalism closer to that of classical Marxism, involving not only production for profit (rather than to meet immediate needs) and individual private property rights, but also class division, in which the immediate producer has no independent access to the means of production. This definition accords with a general view of capitalism as a realm of coercion for the worker, who has no choice but to work for a capitalist. Cudd regards Holmstrom's account of production and wages as 'outdated and false' (p. 263) and emphasises the expansion of freedom of choice of occupation, especially for women, that capitalism has brought with it. Certainly some of the Marxist concepts require considerable modification to be applied to the capitalism of the developed world (less so the developing world). Nevertheless, Holmstrom's definition has the virtue of allowing the distinction between market or exchange society on the one hand, and capitalism proper on the other.

Capitalism, clearly, admits of various definitions, but perhaps the more important question is whether, in assessing whether or not capitalism is good or bad for women, we should take capitalism as it is currently found in the world, or an ideal form of capitalism, to be conjured from the theorist's imagination. The weakest argument that could be madein defence of capitalism is that an ideal form of capitalism is preferable for women to actual forms of non-capitalism (whatever that turns out to be -- we will return to that question shortly). The most adventurous would be to argue for actually existing capitalism in competition with the best theoretical models of alternatives. Between these extremes many other forms of comparison are possible, and part of the discussion between Cudd and Holmstrom is which comparison is the most meaningful.

But what, exactly, are we to compare capitalism with? Throughout the volume four candidates are discussed: traditional pre-capitalist societies; actual existing contemporary or recent socialist and communist societies; actual existing traditional societies; and models of ideal non-capitalism. In comparison with pre-capitalist societies and existing traditional societies, both authors, reasonably enough, agree that the emergence of advanced capitalism has been associated with many advances for women, in terms of life expectancy and health, freedom, opportunity including access to the job market and standard of living. Both authors agree that most capitalist countries still have far to go in terms of gender equality. And the condition of women is especially harsh in the industrialising countries recently joining the capitalist world, as we see in Southeast Asia.

Underneath this agreement is a dispute about causation. Both authors agree that an association is one thing, a causal relation another. To over-simplify, though only a little, Cudd sees capitalism as responsible for the good, and the remaining vestiges of traditional society, including patriarchy, as responsible for the bad. Holmstrom considers that development, rather than capitalism, is responsible for the good and capitalism is a major contributing factor to the bad (p. 289). Both cite supporting material. Holmstrom, for example, points out that even under capitalism most fundamental scientific advances are the result of government funded research in the universities (p. 309), and that life expectancy in Russia improved considerably under Soviet Communism, but fell back with the introduction of the free market economy (p. 310). Cudd remarks that even in countries experiencing rapid industrialisation and grinding work in the urban centres, still the poorest people in the world are self-employed subsistence farmers who are largely untouched by the capitalist economy (p. 266). Many similar observations are offered by both authors, and one is left feeling that no generalisation is likely to be helpful

Although Cudd produces an ideal of capitalism, it is very far from the textbook free market economy. She argues that as the (Lockean) moral foundation of private property rights is the right to sustenance, capitalism requires amelioration of gross inequalities (p. 105). Her capitalism is also more environmentally self-conscious and less materialistic, overcoming commodity fetishism (a rare appeal to Marx's ideas among defenders of capitalism). A universal Nordic state, perhaps. But is this possible? Critics suggest that capitalism can only survive on the overwork and underpay of the vast majority of the world's labour force, accompanied by the unemployment of a substantial portion of the potential labour force, acting as a depressing force on wages. On this view, more enlightened capitalism is simply not representative of what is possible on a world scale. Or are we entitled to be more optimistic about capitalism, and that an enlightened, equitable, non-materialistic, environmentally friendly Cudd-improved capitalism could spread around the whole world? One can be sceptical. For example, environmentally friendly Norway uses little, if any, fossil fuel, relying on its extensive potential for hydro-electric power. But its wealth is built on the vast profits it makes by selling its oil to other countries. Perhaps it is possible to generalise an ideal capitalism, but it will not be straightforward.

Holmstrom too appeals to an ideal model. Her motivation for this is clear. Although Cuba, and previously the Soviet Union, do well on some indicators, especially those connected with gender equality, it would nevertheless take a brave soul to put either forward as a paradigm for future development. What, then, is her ideal of socialism? Rejecting market socialism, in her main contribution Holmstrom gives us just the briefest sketch: socialism would be 'genuinely democratic' both economically and politically, aiming directly at satisfaction of need, on a global scale (p. 253). Critically, socialism will involve democratic planning alongside a much reduced market sector, in order to achieve collective rationality. Social planning is needed so that we can collectively 'control our destiny'. (p. 253) Yet on the very next page Holmstrom, drawing on Chomsky and Hal Draper, suggests that she is offering 'socialism from below' rather than state socialist 'socialism from above'. How collective action problems are to be solved by a society based on 'free voluntary participation' remains a challenge that is not raised or addressed in the few pages offered.

Responding to Cudd's critique that there is too little here to assess, in her final remarks she expands somewhat, pointing out that in her model of socialism alternative plans would be drafted by experts and then democratically voted on by the people, and claims, without providing details, that 'the technical feasibility of planning in the age of computers has been proven' (p. 320). Sadly we are left with the thought that we have been here before, and Nove has demonstrated the difficulties in working out the details.

A book of this nature invites the reviewer to judge who has won the debate. In the spirit of preferring co-operation to competition I would rather make a judgement on the book as a whole. It is an excellent account of the issues. Capitalism has many faults, especially for women, and especially in the rapidly developing world, and it is unclear how much can be remedied within capitalistic structures. It is even less clear what could be put in capitalism's place. Although specialists may find much that is already familiar in this volume, it will remind them of arguments and issues that continue to need urgent and concentrated attention.

[1] Nove, Alec, The Economics of Feasible Socialism (London: George Allen and Unwin, 1983).

[2] Nove, Alec, The Economics of Feasible Socialism Revisited (London: Harper Collins, 1991).