Care of the World: Fear, Responsibility and Justice in the Global Age

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Elena Pulcini, Care of the World: Fear, Responsibility and Justice in the Global Age, Karen Whittle (tr.), Springer, 2013, 272pp., $69.99 (pbk), ISBN 9789400774650.

Reviewed by Kevin W. Gray, American University of Sharjah


Elena Pulcini sets herself the task of writing an alternative version of a theory of global justice, one which draws neither on the dominant Rawlsian or Kantian approaches to the field. For that alone she should be complimented. What Pulcini proposes is not so much a theory of justice, as she herself acknowledges, but a broader ethics of globalization with separate realms of what might be termed global justice and an ethics of care. To develop her thesis -- which is effectively that theories of global justice are alienated from true human relations -- she proposes to find both in the ethics of care and in the reception of psychoanalytic and sociological literature in continental philosophy a unique global ethics. Her appropriation of the philosophy of care should not be understood simply as an alternative model of ethics. Instead, Pulcini takes the development of care (and the converse pathologies which emerge in its place) as a unique learning process developed by modernity as society develops. In this respect, her work is closer to that of Honneth and Habermas than it is to Nel Nodding or Carol Gilligan.

In four stages, Pulcini moves from identifying the problems of modernity, which are ignored by contemporary (read Anglo-American) theories of global justice, to how they play themselves out in the modern world, to a proposal for correcting them. The book itself is a tour de force of what might be labelled alternative versions of theory of justice, borrowing not just from the feminist literature on care (the work of the aforementioned Nodding and Gilligan, and her foils Piaget and Kohlberg), but from the French and German traditions (in addition to Habermas and Honneth, she draws extensively on the work of Ulrich Beck, Hans Blumenberg, Hans Jonas and Günther Anders).

In the first section, Pulcini frames her purpose, which, as she puts it, is to find a path between two pathologies: unlimited individualism and self-obsession, and communitarianism. These pathologies emerge as a result of the learning processes embedded in late capitalist society, which create a distinct phenomenon: the modern self. The modern self emerges as a result of those powers of technology that create new (and potentially unlimited) powers of creation and consumption (35), which appear to the modern subject as powers virtually unfettered by time and space. The modern self does not merely create and consume -- it is also a spectator able to observe events wherever they occur. As a result of technology, the modern self enjoys virtually unlimited access to events on all four corners of the globe (28). Face-to-face with the vertiginous consequences of modernity -- fragmentation, narcissism and powerlessness in the face of technology -- the modern self, she argues, retreats behind post-traditional communitarianism.

The feeling of detachment to locality and to traditional forms of community produces a concomitant pathology. Those same technological processes that destroy the "fabric of traditional belonging" (42) create new communal identities in parallel to the birth of homo economicus and homo politicus. These newly autonomous individuals create and exist inside communities that close themselves off to the outside world, giving rise to what Pulcini labels pathological communitarianism.

In the second section, Pulcini shows how the pathologies of modernity manifest themselves through the various mutations of emotion. Emotion emerges as either endogenous communitarianism (fear of the other as an excess of pathos) or as an absence of pathos (ego-centric indifference). Fear is central to the argument here: fear and its metamorphosis is at the center of Pulcini's theory. Modern political theory has misunderstood fear, treating it, Pulcini claims, as the starting point of the social contract. Fear is a condition of modern politics not merely inside the Hobbesian framework (where fear of the other provides the starting point for a theory of the political and of civil society), but as the origin of (and perhaps, when appropriately studied, the solution to) the crises of globalization. That second type of fear, however, is not Hobbes' fear. It is the result of (what Blumenberg calls) the loss of order (86). Moreover, it is not fear of immediate danger. This fear emerges when the subject ascertains the uncertainty and risk to all people that are produced by technology, as in, for instance, Beck's discussion of risk society (96).

While certainly not absent from pre-modernity, risk as fear is a distinctly modern phenomenon. The rise of advanced means of production, which bring with them the ability to transform the planet, means that modern risk is a form of collective risk, which is not readily localizable in the presence of the other (as it would have been for Hobbes' communitarianism). This risk is grounded instead in the fact that modern technologies prevent us from seeing the distant other whose actions are a risk to our well-being and who, in turn, is threatened by our actions (115). All of humanity, even if cut off from immediate contract with its brethren, exists in the region where our technological omnipotence and our vulnerability to large scale, catastrophic change coexist. As we are all cut off from immediate contact with other inhabitants of the planet, yet experience risk from the consequences of the other, the modern world is not conducive to the development of a true relationship to the risks we enjoy. We are all either spectators or victims (or both) of the modern world (117). As Pulcini argues in the third section, only a reconstructed political theory will close the chasm between the two (137). Fear is not only pathological. Properly understood it will, as Jonas argues, teach us to care for others, in the same way that through "the bonum . . . we know the malum" (144). With respect to the two original pathologies she identified in the first section, Pulcini argues that through appropriate education, the unlimited individualism of the modern age can, through appropriate mechanisms, revert to an individualism that can recognize its own fundamental vulnerability and limitedness. With respect to the latter pathology, the individual can be brought to recognize his connection to all humanity by breaking up the endogamy of modern communities.

Pulcini's strength has been her ability to reconstruct the pathologies of modern industrial risk society. In the third section, however she moves from a critical theory that explains the emergence of the modern individual to what can only be described as a thin normative approach grounded in the work of Levinas and Judith Butler. Her central idea is that the disparate work of Levinas and Butler might serve as a grounding for an ethics of vulnerability, which makes itself known through the presence of the other. Unfortunately, here her approach largely ceases to be diagnostic. While Pulcini is cognizant that her theory of justice developed from an analysis of the pathologies of present society, her suggestions in the latter sections are at most suggestive. She recognizes that true connections to the other are unlikely to emerge in a modern society that has produced both pathological individualism and communitarianism, absent some truly formative event. Yet she is unclear what that might be -- even moments such as the attacks of September 11, she argues, produced not solidarity, but fear of the other (185). While it is easy to suggest the attributes that humanity must possess for such an ethics of care to emerge at the global level, it is substantially harder to imagine how we might acquire them -- and here Pulcini's most minimal of suggestions is that we must be taught that we live in a shared world, one created through common language and actions.

In the concluding section, she returns to Gilligan, as a way to theorize two different moral voices: a morality of rights and equality, and an ethics of care (221). These viewpoints, not strictly speaking in opposition, form the backbone of Pulcini's proposal. She argues that focusing on both philosophical approaches will enable the theorist of global justice to identify both the emancipatory and the pathological components of the morality of rights and equality (222). Such a theory would, presumably, enable the theorist to depart from questions of the fair distribution of resources to the construction of social bonds and an ethics of responsibility for the distant other (228). However, Pulcini rejects previous attempts to reduce the ethics of care to a component of or supplement to contractualist theories of justice -- for instance, in Nussbaum's or Sen's capabilities approach (230-31, 238). Instead, she argues that care must remain a separate component of any theory of ethics in a global age, irreducible to theories of justice itself. Only then will fundamental human relations be restored inside a global ethics (241). However, here again Pulcini's proposal is little more than a sketch on the way to a workable theory.

Thus, while there is a great deal to be said about Pulcini's diagnosis of the pathologies of modernity that is positive, a great deal less can be said about the prescriptions she offers for political theory. It surely must qualify as a legitimate critique of theories of global justice that they are unrealistic and promote an overly economic or neo-liberal account of justice (as Pulcini suggests in her analysis of Rawls and Habermas). However, a theory that substitutes a binary division of labor absent concrete proposals is hardly less abstract and does very little to correct this problem absent a description of the work an ethics of care is supposed to do. For instance, does such an ethics supplement the obligations of the individual, supplement the obligations of the state, or do something else?

Furthermore, the translator did an excessively poor job of rendering the text into readable English. She uses larger words where smaller ones would do, and avoids every teacher's injunction to use simple sentences. In places, the translation is either not idiomatic or simply unreadable. Any review of the text must then be mixed -- it is a work of remarkable elucidation for 150 pages that fails, sadly, to deliver on its promise.