Carnal Hermeneutics

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Richard Kearney and Brian Treanor (eds.), Carnal Hermeneutics, Fordham University Press, 2015, 392pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823265893.

Reviewed by Theodore George, Texas A&M University


Editors Richard Kearney and Brian Treanor furnish a collected volume that promises to expand the scope of contemporary philosophical discussions of hermeneutics to include a broad range of considerations of the body. This, as they recognize, marks a significant departure from the themes customarily taken up by philosophers interested in hermeneutics. Hermeneutics concerns understanding and interpretation and, usually, these themes are treated not in reference to the body but above all in connection with text interpretation, dialogue (or conversation) with other persons, and related matters. Kearney and Treanor, by contrast, bring together a host of perspec­tives on the character of the body as hermeneutical and on the body's distinctive possibilities for hermeneutical experience. In their "Introduction: Carnal Hermeneutics from Head to Foot," they assert that "the theme of carnal hermeneutics" concerns "the surplus of meaning arising from our carnal embodiment, its role in our experience and understanding, and its engagement in the wider world."  Or, as Kearney and Treanor then give summary to this idea, "carnal hermeneutics . . . offers a philosophical approach to the body as interpretation." (1)

Kearney and Treanor, then, propose a genuinely innovative direction in hermeneutics, one that can perhaps be described as both building on and expanding beyond what Gadamer famously described as Heidegger's 'ontological turn' in hermeneutics.[1] Heidegger, with his early elucidation of a 'hermeneutics of facticity,' invokes hermeneutics no longer in the customary context of text interpretation or dialogue but, instead, argues that human beings, in their very being, exist hermeneutically: human life, existence, is a matter of attuned understanding; it is to the very core interpretive. Kearney's and Treanor's approach suggests that this 'ontological turn' needs to be taken one turn further -- toward the body. For, if human life is lived bodily, then embodiment -- or, carnality, as Kearney and Treanor wish to capture this -- must itself be grasped hermeneutically. Human life, existence, must be hermeneutical "all the way down." (1) Yet, if Kearney and Treanor may be understood to call for a 'carnal turn' that expands beyond Heidegger's 'ontological turn,' this book coalesces especially in contributions from and about twentieth- and twenty-first century Francophone philosophy, and gives emphasis to the affinity between hermeneutics and major themes of the movement of phenomenology.

The volume has four parts. Part I, comprised of introductory essays by the editors, is meant to offer "overall genealogies and topologies" of the terms "carnal and hermeneutics." (3) Kearney notes that philosophers associated with twentieth-century phenomenology, such as Edmund Husserl and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, gave serious attention to the body. Even if the rise of hermeneutics in figures such as Gadamer and Ricœur comprised a much-needed intervention to remind phenomenologists that our experience is mediated by language and tradition, hermeneutics allowed concerns about the body to fall into neglect. Kearney seeks to rehabilitate the prospect for a carnal hermeneutics in reference, initially, to Aristotle's "first breakthrough" (19) that touch is a universal medium of sensation and, then, in reference to an elucidation of the flesh, touch, and related themes in Husserl, Jean-Paul Sartre, Immanuel Levinas, and Merleau-Ponty. Providing a master class in the history of a crucial thread of twentieth-century continental European philosophy, Kearney argues in conclusion that Ricœur, in his later writings, all but discovers the possibility of a carnal hermeneutics. Part I also includes an essay by Treanor that further argues for what I am calling a 'carnal turn' in hermeneutics. Treanor maintains that such a turn can provide a response to challenges posed to hermeneutics and other movements in continental European philosophy by a recent renewal of interest in realism thanks to figures such as Quentin Meillassoux, Graham Harmon, Catherine Malabou, and Michel Serres. In a hermeneutical engagement with Serres, in particular, Treanor argues that a carnal hermeneutics is called for to 'mind the gap,' or, to mediate between 'harder' aspects of reality, such as physical objects, and 'softer' aspects, such as those associated with culture. Treanor sees this carnal turn as "a widening of focus, as expansively as possible, to encompass the fullness of the human experience of reality, textual and material," including, on his view, environmental hermeneutics. (73)

The three further parts cannot be treated in adequate detail here, but an overview is possible. The principle that organizes Part II, "Rethinking the Flesh," appears to concern a contemporary milieu of philosophers in France more than any rigidly grasped thematic focus. As Kearney and Treanor indicate, this part is meant to showcase "some major contemporary voices" in the conversation about "carnal hermeneutics." (3) Indeed, it does. This part of the volume represents a remarkable selection of contributions, some published previously and appearing here in edited or modified form, by luminary philosophers in contemporary Francophone philosophy: Jean-Luc Nancy, Jean-Louis Chrétien, Julia Kristeva, Michel Henry, Jean-Luc Marion, and Ricœur. In the context of concerns that orient the volume, the notion of the flesh signifies, roughly, our lived experience as embodied beings. While the essays in this section develop insights into the flesh in one manner or another, they do so in reference to a number of topics. These topics include Nancy's reflections on touching, motility, and emotion, Chrétien's hermeneutical rehabilitation of the body as it is treated in important moments of the reception of the Song of Songs in Western thought, Kristeva's examination of disability, and Henry's and Marion's considerations of the theme of life. This part concludes with a piece by Ricœur, translated into English for the first time, on history, memory, and writing.

Part III, "Matters of Touch," includes essays that examine hermeneutical dimensions of the experience of touch and related experiences of embodiment. If hermeneutics is customarily concerned with text interpretation and dialogue with other persons, a central concern of this part is with our experience of the sense of touch as a pre- or non-linguistic possibility of intelligibility or discernment. This part includes essays by Edward S. Casey, David Wood, Anne O'Byrne, Emmanuel Alloa, Dermot Moran, and Ted Toadvine. Alloa examines what he, following a concept associated with Kearney's research, characterizes as a 'diacritical hermeneutics' of embodied experience in reference to Aristotle's examination of the sense of touch. Moran, in his essay, argues that (and how) the later Merleau-Ponty reinterprets and transforms Husserl's elucidation of the significance of the 'double sensation' we experience in touch. In this part, the theme of touch, too, is taken up in reference to a number of topics: Casey's consideration of what it is like to be a body in solitary confinement; Wood's attempts to imagine "a broader practice of carnal hermeneutics" (173); various reflection on a number of distinct but potentially related experiences of the body; O'Byrne's consideration of the possibility of an intergenerational hermeneutics in connection with the navel or umbilicus; and Toadvine's intervention in contemporary discourses about biodiversity with the notion of a diacritics of life.

Part IV, "Divine Bodies," features essays that contribute to the possibility of a carnal hermeneutics though considerations of figures and themes from the Judeo-Christian heritage. This part has a further essay by Kristeva, in which she considers the psychoanalytic and hermeneutical significance of Teresa of Avila's mystical experiences of the divine. In addition to this essay, Shelly Rambo takes up Gregory of Nyssa's account of Macrina to develop novel insights in trauma theory; Emmanuel Falque examines possibilities of meaning associated with the Eucharist that are excluded by norms of inquiry in phenomenological investigation; Karmen MacKendrick discerns in the Book of Genesis the possibility of a prelapsarian language characterized not by domination over creation but instead by embodied harmony inscribed in the materiality of the world; and John Panteleimon Manoussakis reconsiders the Christian notion of 'the word made flesh,' arguing that this should not be taken as a call to spiritualize the flesh, but, rather, to incorporate spirit into the flesh.

This is an impressive volume that makes a notable contribution. It gathers together a significant number of contributions by some of the most prominent figures in contemporary continental philosophy on topics in a leading-edge area of research. It is true that the contributors take such diverse approaches and address such diverse themes that their essays cannot be reduced to any narrowly defined program of research. But, the call for a carnal hermeneutics is not supposed to further any pre-established agenda, or, as Kearney and Treanor put the point, "the essays in this volume are not conclusions but rather openings to further dialogue and debate."  (11).

It should also be observed that despite its expansive scope, as well as the novelty of the call for a carnal hermeneutics, there are still other major voices that may also need to be brought into the fold of such dialogue and debate. It is not difficult to imagine that some of Gadamer's later pieces on the theme of health, for example, can help give contour to the possibility of a carnal hermeneutics. Moreover, within contemporary continental European philosophy, one thinks perhaps in particular of Günter Figal's recent contributions to the development of a hermeneutics of life, and, with it, of the body, in his Objectivity: The Hermeneutical and Philosophy and other writings.[2] It should, however, be viewed as a strength of this volume that it suggests the need to bring these and other figures into the conversation.

This book is not only an invaluable resource for scholars interested in new developments in hermeneutics, and, more generally, in continental European philosophy. It is also likely to become an important touchstone of future debate.

[1] See Hans-Georg Gadamer, Truth and Method, Second Revised Edition, Trans. Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall, (Continuum, 1995), 243-264.

[2] See Günter Figal, Objectivity: The Hermeneutical and Philosophy, trans. Theodore D. George (State University of New York Press, 2010).