Carnap and Twentieth-Century Thought: Explication as Enlightenment

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A.W. Carus, Carnap and Twentieth-Century Thought: Explication as Enlightenment, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 346 pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862271.

Reviewed by Alan Richardson, University of British Columbia


There was a time, not long ago, when the philosophy of Rudolf Carnap was easy to comprehend. Carnap was the ultimate simple-minded logical positivist, committed to a radical empiricist account of science and critique of metaphysics, and dedicated to a notion of analyticity needed to provide an account of the a priority of mathematics consistent with that empiricism. This is the Carnap familiar from the work of W.V. Quine, A.J. Ayer, Hilary Putnam and others. For about a quarter century, however, this Carnap has been joined by others: we have the neo-Kantian Carnap of Michael Friedman, the Husserlian Carnap of Guillermo Rosado Haddock, the engineering Carnap of Richard Creath, and so on. A.W. Carus's book introduces us to the latest Carnap, Carnap the Enlightenment philosopher. Carus himself calls this thesis "startling" and notes it to be likely initially to "sound incredible" (p. 32). Nonetheless, on his view, the key to completing the Enlightenment project comes in a detailed understanding of the technical means of, motivations for, and consequences of Carnap's mature project of the explication of concepts. Carus's project for Carnap's philosophy is the most ambitious yet, and his book is an historically and philosophically demanding one that repays close attention.

Carus's Carnap provides, as noted, the best hope for philosophy to overcome the obstacles to Enlightenment and, thus, to save us from the ravages of postmodernist romanticism and pluralism. Even before she can begin to evaluate the argument for explication as the key to Enlightenment, therefore, the reader is faced with at least two challenges. First, there is the question of genre -- what sort of book is this? In the introduction, Carus calls his work, as the French like to say, "a history of the present." That is, the primary goal seems not to be a detailed, historically accurate rendering of Carnap's own philosophy, but an effort to mine that philosophy for resources we can use today. Carus tells us that his story draws lessons from Carnap's work that were "never fully enunciated by Carnap" and that "never fully crystallized, probably not even in [Carnap's] own mind" (p. 38). Indeed, Carus tells us that his history is "unashamedly teleological," presenting the project of explication as that toward which Carnap was working from the beginning (p. 40).

The second challenge is what to make of the framework for the narrative. For a book that announces in its title that it will find Carnap's place in twentieth-century thought, the Enlightenment might seem a bit further back than we need to go. Carus is right that it is startling to think of Carnap as an Enlightenment philosopher; surely no one would confuse any single paragraph of Carnap's work with a paragraph from any significant philosophical figure from the Enlightenment. Here the grain of salt that must be provided by the reader is to discover what Carus means by 'Enlightenment'. This term is not, in his parlance, a term for a specific time period or historically-bound set of projects. 'Enlightenment' covers, it seems, any philosophical project that ties moral and social progress to the progress of (especially scientific) knowledge; it follows that, for example, Aristotle is an Enlightenment philosopher, as the term is used in the book (cf. p. 272). What Carnap's project of explication provides is a way forward with a pair of general problems from within this very broadly construed version of Enlightenment: what is (scientific) knowledge and what secures it as knowledge, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, what role should there be for values or affect in human life, if we foreground the importance of knowledge as the Enlightenment philosophers do.

With these two problems firmly in mind, the reader swiftly proceeds to the third substantial (and easily the greatest) difficulty in the text. Having been prepared to read a high-level interpretative account of Carnap's project of explication within a broad understanding of the Enlightenment, the reader discovers that the bulk of the text -- certainly at least Chapters Four through Nine -- in fact consists of painstaking accounts of specific episodes in the work of early Carnap. Not only are the philosophical details of, for example, Carnap's dissertation and its relations to an earlier, unpublished draft difficult to keep track of, but the story is placed within a rich context of complicated post-Kantian philosophical projects involving figures such as Hermann von Helmholtz, Henri Poincaré, Hugo Dingler, Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, Hans Vaihinger, Edmund Husserl, and others. For those in the Carnap business, these chapters are where the action is, and working Carnap scholars will find these chapters to be rich in new ideas, interpretations, and archival evidence. Nonetheless, nothing in the set-up for the book quite prepares the reader for this material; indeed it might seem that the book as written is not the book of the introduction -- explication as the main theme is not taken up again until the final two chapters.

While it is true that the book is more exacting in historical and philosophical detail than a reader might have been led to believe by its introductory chapter, the history of Carnap's early work is, as Carus said it would be, a leading history. Although Carus does take us through a wide range of historical figures and through many details of the main projects in Carnap's early work (projects that will likely seem stranger than one would have imagined), the ultimate account of Carnap is a rather domesticated one. Thus, while due notice is given to the neo-Kantian, conventionalist, and phenomenological details of Carnap's dissertation, for example, Carus is at pains to present Carnap's neo-Kantianism as "minimal" and to frame Carnap's invocation of Husserl, to my mind implausibly, as a "proposal for experimental psychology" (p. 135, 130). So the young Carnap, despite his debts to a wide range of post-Kantian philosophical projects, is ultimately reclaimed not merely as an empiricist from the beginning but even as a sort of naturalistic empiricist. In other words, appearance to the contrary notwithstanding, Carnap is and always has been one of us.

As someone whose own work on Carnap is (more implicitly than explicitly) at issue in these chapters of the book, I cannot resist making at least one comment on the matter. The question of the depth of Carnap's early neo-Kantianism depends on the larger issue of what it is to be a neo-Kantian. This is an under-specified question, of course, since there were lots of different schools of folks who thought of themselves as neo-Kantians. Moreover, there are many accounts of Kant's own principal philosophical significance. Depending upon which of these we plump for, we will carve the post-Kantian world -- including those who called themselves neo-Kantians -- in vastly different ways. Carus's Kant seems to be concerned primarily with "anthropomorphism" in epistemology -- that is, with the transcendental explanation of the possibility of synthetic a priori knowledge that sees such knowledge as expressing the forms in the (transcendental) mind. My own view is that this was not the key concern of, for example, the last generation of philosophers working out the Marburg neo-Kantian line. Their emphasis was not on a transcendental psychological explanation of the possibility of synthetic a priori knowledge but on the attempt to explicate the methodological significance of the Kantian synthetic a priori within the context of the exact sciences. This difference in understanding the primary intent of the scientific neo-Kantianism of Paul Natorp (circa 1910), Ernst Cassirer, Jonas Cohn, and, Carnap's dissertation director, Bruno Bauch, is a large part of my diagnosis of the difference between Carus and myself on the influence of Marburg neo-Kantianism on Carnap. There are many details on which Carnap differs fundamentally with even the late Marburg views but the Marburgers were important for at least two reasons in particular within the larger German epistemological context of Carnap's early work. First, they were clear that the principal location of continuing interest in Kant's epistemology was in the way it directed attention to the knowledge claims made in the exact sciences. Second, they held that the key to Kant's views on the synthetic a priori came not in transcendental psychology but in transcendental logic, disciplines that the Marburgers, unlike Kant himself, wanted as much as possible to separate. What mattered most to them was the objectifying role of mathematical form within the exact sciences (not a transcendental psychological explanation of why such form has that role), and they located their differences from other projects such as positivism and logicism along this axis.

Such details aside, Carus argues that Carnap's mature philosophy offers the best current hope for overcoming the two problems with Enlightenment mentioned above because it is a piecemeal project in linguistic engineering that makes minimal demands upon a community of people who cannot be expected to share a language, a set of theoretical commitments, or a set of values. Carus presents the historical Carnap as principally interested in specific projects within the broader explication program -- semantics and confirmation theory or logical probability among them. However, Carus directs his main interest toward the larger program itself and how it might be deployed within the fragmented communities in which we currently live. In the final chapter Carus discusses the virtues he sees in Carnapian linguistic engineering by contrasting it to both Rawls's contractarian liberalism and Habermas's theory of communicative action. Both of the latter projects, according to Carus, make far more substantial demands on agreement ex ante than does Carnap's project, rendering them both incapable of dealing with the sorts of epistemic communities extant in the world today.

The argument of the final chapter is too complicated to summarize here. For my own part, I think Carus has captured very well Carnap's attitude toward certain sorts of philosophical questions and how Carnap would attempt to sort out various forms of epistemological impasse. I am less sanguine than Carus about both the unproblematic nature of the explication program and its ultimate likelihood in solving on-the-ground epistemological problems. As to the first issue, it will surprise readers that Carus discusses the explication program without discussing in detail its relations to the analytic/synthetic debate. Those who side with Quine will be suspicious here; after all, how can even piecemeal explication go forward unless we can present a constructed or formal (portion of a) language in which we can recognize certain sentences as meaning postulates, and, thus, as analytic? Perhaps Carus supposes that we can make do with the notion of a meaning postulate or meaning proposal from within a project of pure pragmatics and let analyticity more generally fall where it may.

Two points follow from this. First, Carnap throughout his career very much wanted to use any portion of mathematics without further ado as a tool for concept construction and clarification -- for example, the measurement of length, of time, of temperature, and so on are necessary for mathematical physics, which early and late was Carnap's paradigm example of a well-grounded and objective knowledge system. However, in order for mathematics itself to play that role, it seems Carnap will have to account for any bit of mathematics as nothing more than a conceptual tool that makes no claim about the world -- that is, Carnap will need mathematics to be analytic. Perhaps Carus does not wish to follow Carnap here but there are certainly sticky philosophical issues in how far we can push explication as the project of Enlightenment epistemology if the explication project cannot account for (and rely upon) mathematization in science.

Second, Carnap's conceptual engineering project seems to have certain limitations that render its general applicability unclear. Is every epistemological problem in which we are interested either an empirical or an engineering problem or some mixture of those two and nothing else? Can engineering problems be solved by an agreed-upon set of "framework values" together with the personal values of each individual (cf. p. 308)? Here is an actual problem in the world in which we live: there are communities ravaged by drug addiction. Where I live we are at the forefront of harm reduction research and the implementation of some of the findings of that research. The political debate is, to my mind, not so much about whether there is some good in implementing that research as it is about what sort of problem drug addiction in the first place genuinely is. Some view it simply as a public health issue whereas others find it to be at least in part a moral problem. The actual historical Carnap, given his noncognitivism about moral claims, seems not to provide resources for overcoming this sort of impasse -- he simply will take a side: addiction cannot be a moral problem, since there is no realm of values that determine the objective moral value of the actions or character of addicts. Carus's Carnap is more complicated on issues of value and valuation but not in ways that would enable us to implement his ideas productively in this sort of disagreement. Moreover, it is interest in this sort of disagreement, and not any form of Romanticism, upon which several of the most important twentieth-century critiques of Enlightenment, notably those of Theodor Adorno and Michel Foucault, are based: a means-ends calculation or a risk-benefit calculation may be what is available from the engineering perspective, but why is the engineering perspective the only or the best perspective to take on human problems? Indeed, whose notion of "problem" is presupposed in framing things this way in the first place?

Carus's book leaves, that is to say, more to be done to specify and implement the project he announces. One can only hope that he continues to work in this vein and to inspire others to do so also. I am not convinced that what is at stake in interpreting Carnap's philosophy is ultimately our Western way of life, but, given the well-known social projects of the Vienna Circle, it would not be surprising if some aspects of interpreting Carnap's project aided in our philosophical understanding of our own social projects. I hope this review has given some indication of the multiple levels on which Carus's book is worth engaging philosophically. The book will be central to the continuing detailed scholarly discussions of Carnap's philosophy. More than this, it will, I hope, help raise to consciousness several larger issues regarding the social import of key projects within analytic philosophy.