Carnap, Quine, and Putnam on Methods of Inquiry

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Gary Ebbs, Carnap, Quine, and Putnam on Methods of Inquiry, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 278pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107178151.

Reviewed by Sander Verhaegh, Tilburg University


Rudolf Carnap, W. V. Quine, and Hilary Putnam are probably the three most central figures in mid-twentieth-century American philosophy. Their debates about meaning, translation, and ontology largely set the agenda for analytic philosophers in the first decades after WWII. Most historians believe that beneath these philosophical debates lies a more fundamental disagreement about the nature of science, philosophy, and our methods of inquiry. That is, Quine is often viewed as slaying the (supposedly) Carnapian distinction between science and philosophy, whereas Putnam is commonly read as dismissing both Carnap's positivism and Quine's scientific naturalism.

Gary Ebbs offers an exciting alternative interpretation. In eleven essays, an introduction, and an afterword, he argues that at this more fundamental level Carnap's, Quine's, and Putnam's positions are largely the same. According to Ebbs, the three all accept the following four principles about the nature of inquiry:

  1. In our pursuit of truth, we can do no better than to start in the middle, relying on already established beliefs and inferences and applying our best methods for reevaluating particular beliefs and inferences and arriving at new ones.
  2. No part of our supposed knowledge, no matter how clear it seems to us or how firmly we now hold it, is unrevisable or guaranteed to be true.
  3. Insofar as traditional philosophical conceptions of reason, justification, and apriority conflict with the first two principles, they should be abandoned.
  4. A central task of philosophy is to clarify and facilitate our rational inquiries by replacing terms and theories that we find useful in some ways, but problematic in others, with new terms and theories that are as clear and unproblematic to us as the terms and methods of our best scientific theories. (pp. 1-2)

Carnap, Quine, and Putnam, in other words, all dismiss traditional inflated conceptions of philosophical inquiry and replace them with a deeply fallibilistic, explication-based picture in which there is no perspective external to the discourses we find useful in our everyday and scientific inquiries. Or, as Carnap put it, "all work is done according to strict scientific methods and not by means of 'higher' or 'deeper' insights" (Carnap 1934, 46).

In developing this alternative reading, Ebbs does not aim to downplay the philosophical disagreements between Carnap, Quine, and Putnam. Instead, he offers a reinterpretation of those discussions. Rather than dismissing the debate about the analytic-synthetic distinction, for instance, he shows that Quine, in arguing that Carnap has failed to "explain [the] term 'analytic' in a language suited for and used in the mature natural sciences" (p. 133), is just adopting Carnap's method of inquiry and improving his views from within. He was, as Quine himself has argued, "just being more Carnapian than Carnap in being critical in this question" (Quine 1994, 228). Likewise, in discussing the Quine-Putnam debate about transtheoretical terms, Ebbs interprets Putnam as out-Quining Quine in urging for an account of truth and reference that accords with "the identifications of agreements and disagreements . . . that we actually make in the midst of our everyday and scientific inquiries" (p. 206).

Although Ebbs' historical claim raises some questions -- e.g., is his reading of Carnap compatible with Michael Friedman's 'Kantian interpretation'? how would he explain the numerous miscommunications between Carnap and Quine in the 1940s and 1950s? and could his fundamental principles (1)-(4) also be used to explain Putnam's frequent changes of position? -- the reader should not expect a detailed discussion of such questions. This is not a complaint, however. For Ebbs chooses a different method to justify his reading. Rather than starting from a neutral position between several competing interpretations and trying to make a case for his interpretation over the other contenders, he starts from the assumption that his reading of Carnap, Quine, and Putnam is correct and shows that it can help us to (i) clarify their views, (ii) to dissolve some influential objections to their positions, and (iii) to improve on their views by showing how his interpretation opens new and previously overlooked alternative accounts of truth, justification, and language use. Ebbs, in other words, is himself adopting the very method of inquiry he attributes to Carnap, Quine, and Putnam; he is 'starting in the middle' and he aims to "improve, clarify, and understand" their positions "from within" (Quine 1975, 72).

Because it is impossible to discuss all eleven essays in one review, let me discuss some examples of each of the strategies (i)-(iii). In Chapter 3, "Carnap and Quine on Truth by Convention", first published in Mind,[1] Ebbs shows how his reading of the Carnap-Quine debate can help us to clarify Quine's goals in "Truth by Convention" (1936). Ebbs argues that Quine's arguments against the idea that logic is true by convention were not aimed at Carnap, but were the result of an attempt to evaluate an option that Quine himself found appealing. Ebbs shows that the standard interpretation of "Truth by Convention" is misguided on at least two points: (a) Carnap was never committed to the view that Quine dismisses, and (b) Quine himself believed that some parts of science (e.g. set theory) are true by convention. But is not Quine's naturalism incompatible with the view that some claims are true by convention? It is precisely at this point that Ebbs' novel interpretation illuminates Quine's position:

a scientific naturalist selects and formulates the truths that 'count for most'. [Quine] begins with the obvious point that the truths that 'count' for most' for a scientific naturalist are just the ones she affirms when, in the course of her inquiries, she adopts particular scientific theories and hypotheses. All these truths may be called 'explanatory' in one good, though very broad, sense of that flexible word. The truths that are 'explanatory' in this encompassing sense are just the ones that it is the aim of science to affirm. It follows that we have no grip on what it is to be 'explanatory' in this encompassing sense apart from our own ongoing scientific inquiries. In particular, if in the course of our inquiries we set forth some axioms or postulates "unaccompanied by any attempt at justification other than in terms of elegance and convenience" (Quine [1963, 393]), then these truths count as 'explanatory' in the same broad sense that theories and hypotheses in physics do. (pp. 80-81)

Note that this account has serious implications for what has often been called the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument. Although Ebbs, except for some brief remarks on page 60, does not drive this point home, his account implies that Quine (and Putnam?) do not have to worry about the parts of set theory that are 'dispensable' from a physicist's point of view. Quine's notorious defense of the axiom of constructibility (V = L), for example, can be simply read as an attempt to submit set theory "to the considerations of simplicity, economy, and naturalness that contribute to the molding of scientific theories generally" (Quine 1992, 95); it does not have to be interpreted as a desperate attempt to adjust his views about set theory to make them compatible with his indispensability defense. Ebbs' reading, in other words, implies that the indispensability thesis should be interpreted differently; it should simply be read as the judgment that our best overall empirical theory of nature contains set theory (in particular, in most of Quine's work, a set theory governed by the axiom of constructibility).

Chapter 5 ("Quine Gets the Last Word") is an excellent example of how Ebbs' interpretation can contribute to dissolving a wide variety of influential objections to Carnap's, Quine's, and Putnam's views. This paper, first published in The Journal of Philosophy, is mandatory reading for anyone working on Quine. Ebbs shows how a broad range of influential objections to Quine's views -- e.g. Jaegwon Kim's argument that there is no room for a normative notion of justification in a naturalized epistemology, or H. P. Grice and P. F. Strawson's claim that Quine's naturalism leads to the conclusion that our sentences are meaningless -- ultimately boil down to a fundamental misunderstanding of Quine's radical minimalist understanding of language use. Kim, Grice, and Strawson (but also Thomas Nagel, Saul Kripke, John McDowell, and Michael Dummett) fail to see that if we are truly working from within, we do not require external extra-scientific criteria for justification, truth, and significance. As Ebbs puts it in his reply to Kim, for example, the objection that Quine's project has nothing to do with epistemology is valid

only if we cling dogmatically to the claim that if we abandon the traditional epistemologist's assumption that there are substantive general principles for evaluating and justifying assertions, we lose our grip on what it is to justify, defend, and revise our assertions from the standpoint of a given scientific discipline (p. 125).

The point of Quine's naturalism, Ebbs shows, is that the traditional epistemologist's assumption can be abandoned without loss.

Chapter 10 ("Truth and Transtheoretical Terms") is a nice example of Ebbs' attempts to improve on the work of Carnap, Quine, and Putnam. In his Afterword, Ebbs explains that the essays in his volume together contribute to the development of

a new minimalist conception of language use and justification that combines Tarski-style disquotational accounts of truth and satisfaction (reference) for the words we can directly use, with our practical identifications of words between speakers and across time, to yield a minimalist account of transtheoretical terms. (p. 257)

Chapter 10 constitutes one of Ebbs' most significant contributions to this new minimalist conception -- an account he has developed in more detail in Truth and Words (2009). He submits that Putnam has convincingly shown that in science and in everyday life we often identify reference transtheoretically. When we now read Niels Bohr's 1911 claim that electrons at each moment have a determinate position and momentum, for example, we generally take the reference of his term 'electron' to be the same as ours, despite the fundamental changes in our theories about electrons (Putnam 1973, 197). Still, Ebbs shows that Putnam is mistaken in arguing that Quine's deflationary theory of truth and reference leads to the conclusion that two speakers cannot genuinely agree or disagree with each other. Ebbs goes on to sketch a new theory of truth and reference that is both deflationary and does justice to Putnam's conclusions about our actual practices of agreeing and disagreeing. Likewise, new theoretical options are revealed and developed in Chapter 7 ("Can First-Order Logical Truth Be Defined in Purely Extensional Terms?"), where Ebbs outlines a new extensional definition of logical truth, and Chapter 9 ("Conditionalization and Conceptual Change: Chalmers in Defense of a Dogma"), where he combines his account about our practices of identifying transtheoretical terms with a theory about revisable Bayesian confirmational commitments, while dismissing David Chalmers' (2011) argument that Quine's and Putnam's claim that every belief is rationally revisable is incompatible with Bayesian conditionalization.

Ebbs' volume, in sum, is an important publication from both an historical and a systematic point of view. It offers a new perspective on the relation between Carnap, Quine, and Putnam, as well as a substantive contribution to ongoing systematic debates about truth, justification, and language use. As such, it will be of interest and value not only to historians of analytic philosophy, but also to all philosophers who believe that Carnap's, Quine's, and Putnam's most fundamental insights deserve continuous discussion and adaptation.


Carnap, R. (1934). Die Aufgabe der Wissenschaftslogic. Translated as The Task of the Logic of Science. In McGuinness, B. (1987, ed.). Unified Science: The Vienna Circle Mongraph Series Originally Edited by Otto Neurath, pp. 46-66. D. Reidel.

Chalmers, D. (2011). Revisability and Conceptual Change in 'Two Dogmas of Empiricism'. Journal of Philosophy, 108(8):387-415

Ebbs, G. (2009). Truth and Words. Oxford University Press.

Putnam, H. (1973). Explanation and Reference. In Putnam (1975). Mind, Language, and Reality: Philosophical Papers, vol. 2, pp. 196-214. Cambridge University Press.

Quine, W. V. (1936). Truth by Convention. In Quine (1976). The Ways of Paradox. Revised and enlarged edition, pp. 77-106. Harvard University Press.

Quine, W. V. (1963). Carnap and Logical Truth. In Schilpp, P. A. (ed.). The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap. Open Court.

Quine, W. V. (1975). Five Milestones of Empiricism. In Quine (1981). Theories and Things, pp. 67-72. Harvard University Press.

Quine, W. V. (1992). Pursuit of Truth. Revised edition. Harvard University Press.

Quine, W. V. (1994). Exchange Between Donald Davidson and W. V. Quine Following Davidson's Lecture. In Føllesdal, D. and Quine, D. B. (2008, eds.). Quine in Dialogue, pp. 152-156. Harvard University Press


This research is funded by The Netherlands Organisation for Scientific Research (NWO, grant 275-20-064).

[1] Nine of the eleven essays in the volume have been previously published. Chapters 2 (“Carnap on Ontology”) and 6 (“Reading Quine’s Claim that Definitional Abbreviations Create Synonymies”) as well as the Introduction and the Afterword are new.