John Cottingham’s book collects 15 essays written over three decades — from “A Brute to Brutes? Descartes’s Treatment of Animals” in 1978 to “Plato’s Sun and Descartes’s Stove: Contemplation and Control in Cartesian Philosophy” in 2007. A lengthy introduction, “Descartes, the Synoptic Philosopher”, composed for the volume, also uses previously published material. The articles are not reproduced in chronological order but regrouped systematically and divided in four chapters. The first (containing the introduction) serves as an “Overview”, while the second contains two papers on “Descartes’s Position in Philosophy”. The third brings together six somewhat loosely connected papers under the rubric of “Mind and World”. The fourth and last chapter contains the most recent papers, which are perhaps also Cottingham’s most original contributions, bearing on topics related to Cartesian ethics, moral psychology and theology. Together they reflect the journey of a prolific Descartes scholar who has defended and promoted Descartes’s philosophy during the last four decades — not least as a translator and co-editor of the standard English edition of Descartes’s Philosophical Writings.1
The attraction of the volume is the broad range of topics it covers, the thorough knowledge of Descartes’s writings, and the wide philosophical culture that Cottingham’s gloss on them displays. Cottingham’s Descartes moves, roughly, between Platonic illuminism, on the one hand, and Humean naturalism (tempered with some lessons from Wittgenstein), on the other. This wide perspective gives the essays their distinctive character and is most fruitfully at work in the elegant and stimulating paper on the controversial subject of “Descartes and the Voluntariness of Belief” (2002). The drawback is a certain repetitiousness that can get tedious and some inconsistencies due to changes of mind over the years that are not signaled or explained — most of which could have been avoided if more editorial work had been done for the volume. Written as they are for different contexts, some of the papers are more sweeping and less probing than others, but the persistent reader will also find many careful and instructive discussions to reflect on, be inspired by, or, as the case may be, take issue with. Some of these are now classics, like the one about animals (1978) that was among the first in the Anglophone literature to defend Descartes’s treatment of the subject, the paper discussing Spinoza’s critique of Descartes on the intellect and will (1988) (which I will get back to), and the paper on “Cartesian Ethics: Reason and Passion” (1996) — a subject also dealt with in other more recent papers. I will first look at Cottingham’s discussion of Descartes’s position in philosophy, a topic that has much exercised him over the years.
Every student of Descartes is faced with the tension between the revolutionary ambitions of Descartes’s philosophy of nature and his heavy reliance on the philosophical tradition when working out his metaphysical views of God, mind, matter and their relationship. A concern that recurs from the first to the last chapter of Cottingham’s book is setting the record straight when it comes to Descartes’s claims to originality, and his fame as “the father of modern philosophy”. These topics have their historiographical interest, yet too many of the papers start with overviews of various images of Descartes found in contemporary philosophical literature, where some one agenda — “rationalist”, “epistemologist” or other — is attributed to him, which Cottingham rejects as overly one-sided-overviews. These are redundant since the collection starts with three general survey essays dealing with precisely such images.
Thus, in “A New Start? Cartesian Metaphysics and the Emergence of Modern Philosophy” (1992) Cottingham seeks to give credit to Descartes — “one of the founders of the ‘modern’ world picture”
- for his new unified philosophical system based on mathematical principles and a mechanistic (non-teleological) model of explanation, while at the same chiding him for his heavy debt to the tradition, e.g., in making use of Augustinian and neo-Skeptic ideas in his epistemology. This debt to tradition, Cottingham explains, was dictated by the need to solve epistemological problems, which “forced him to abandon the radical and progressive stance which he so proudly maintained in the other (more scientific) parts of his programme.” The attempt to support “the trunk of his physics by unearthing its metaphysical roots, gradually overwhelmed Descartes by its complexity” and forced him “to fall back on the very scholastic apparatus that he so derided in his scientific work” (p. 58).
It here sounds as if Descartes had no prior philosophical commitments (that he was “an opportunist” is evident to Cottingham) and turned to metaphysics merely to solve scientific and epistemological problems. Cottingham seems indeed to follow Charles Adam in claiming that the only thing Descartes expected from metaphysics was to provide a firm support of scientific truth. So he launched into metaphysics merely as an afterthought, giving it no systematic attention until he came to compose the Discourse, and even there, his treatment of it is “schematic in the extreme” (p. 59). As a devout Catholic Descartes had no problem in granting that “the divine gift of reason” must be reliable when conscientiously used. His problem was to prove this to non-believers, and so the task of grounding science “boiled down to one single undertaking: proving the existence of God”, a task that required heavy use of "the very apparatus of traditional learning … denounced earlier in the Discourse". As an example Cottingham mentions the fourth paragraph of Part Four of the Discourse, where Descartes launches into a standard theme of Platonist medieval theology in enquiring about the origin of the idea of perfection, which he, being imperfect and doubting, could not have found in himself. The argument from the idea of a greater perfection to the existence of a greater perfection as sketched in the Discourse rests, as Descartes readily admits in a letter to Father Vatier of February 1638, on his theory of ideas and their objective reality. It thus presupposes a traditional technical apparatus unveiled in more detail in the Meditations - the very work introduced with the commitment to demolish everything completely “once in the course of my life” (p. 65).
Pointing out these kinds of “inconsistencies” in Descartes’s writings is not uncommon, but a more challenging task is working out how Descartes adapts the metaphysical themes and doctrines on which he relies to his own purposes and to what extent they serve his other commitments. Moreover, it is far from obvious that the demolition project announced in the Discourse and the Meditations is inconsistent with the acceptance of the “Platonist” ideas at work wherever Descartes defends his metaphysical doctrine. The demolition project is directed specifically at the principles underlying Aristotelian physics, so it undermines any belief based on the senses. It is a matter of controversy whether other metaphysical principles — other than the principle that there is nothing in the intellect that does not derive from the senses — were touched by the Cartesian doubt. To the extent that the project is seen as one of defending the intellect over and above the senses, it is not clear that the intellect needs or can be given a grounding. What the use of the arguments from doubt can teach us is that they depend on the same source as the arguments devised to test these principles, namely the authority of human reason itself, and cannot therefore be undermined by them.
One may still share the uneasiness Cottingham (and before him Kenny) expresses at Descartes’s attempts to market the Scholastic principles he relies on in his Third Meditation proofs of God’s existence as manifest to natural light (AT 7 40: CSM 2 28)2. Among these is the “baffling” principle that “there is at least as much [reality] in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause”, to say nothing of its application to the representational content of our ideas. Using Kenny’s phrasing from another context Cottingham writes:
Even before Descartes is ready to take the crucial step of inferring the existence of a supreme being as the source of his idea of perfection, he has given the game away: the supposedly unencumbered deliverances of the natural light are deeply tainted with the philosophical preconceptions that he had imbibed as a schoolboy at la Flèche. (p. 70)3
One could argue that in presenting the principles in question as manifest to natural light, they are at least offered to the scrutiny of anyone caring to use this light, as opposed to being marketed merely on account of some School authority. Those who do not find them evident are free to reject them and take the consequences. It does not seem fair therefore to claim that “the cog-wheel of scholasticism now drives the whole machine” (p. 70). The whole machine, supposedly, is Cartesian science. To take Cartesian metaphysics to be merely a support or grounding of the scientific enterprise, is a variant of traditional foundationalist (or as Cottingham prefers to call them, “epistemological”) readings, which belongs among the oversimplified canonical images of Descartes that Cottingham himself elsewhere opposes.
Once one embarks on such simplistic or one-sided readings, it is easy to find holes in the foundation the sciences are supposed to rest on, or to show the incompleteness of the project attributed to Descartes. According to Cottingham, among the most pervasive shortcomings in Descartes’s challenge to preconceived opinion is the lack of any “serious analysis, let alone critique, of the concept of causation itself”, a task that “was left to Malebranche and Hume”. This sounds like revisionist history of philosophy, where one looks for lacunas in earlier doctrines by considering them in the light of later developments, and as such it is not very helpful. If Descartes did not discuss the concept of causation explicitly, nevertheless his notion of causation by impact, his account (or lack of account) of the mind-body interaction, his conception of time and of God’s role in continuous creation all paved the way for Malebranche’s and Hume’s conclusions. Again, the more interesting task here would be to see how far Descartes actually went in transforming the notion of causality — not just in physics but in metaphysics as well (e.g., in the discussion with Arnauld about the notion of efficient causality (AT 7 235-245, CSM 2 164-170).
Cottingham can certainly do better, as in his more recent paper on “The Role of God in Descartes’s Metaphysics”(2006), which justly draws attention to “something that is curiously absent from all the iconic images … so far mentioned”. In tune with the modern secularist and naturalist agendas of the Anglophone philosophical academy, the latter overlook the pervasive appeal to God, whose nature and existence are rightly said to “lie at the very heart of his entire philosophical system” (p. 255).
The eclipse of God from contemporary conceptions of Cartesianism cannot be explained only by the reigning naturalism, for, as Cottingham also points out, Descartes’s unorthodox theological views never made him a favorite of Catholicism. Descartes’s famous new starting point also invited misleadingly subjectivist interpretations that contribute to the neglect of his theology. As Cottingham stresses however, the primacy of the thinking I should not conceal the frail and temporary nature of his self-awareness and complete dependence on “a power greater than himself”. The priority of the self over God is merely epistemic and not a “priority in nature”. The infinite substance (God) has more reality than “a finite substance such as myself”. In fact my “very recognition of my imperfection … already presupposes the ontological priority of this greater and more perfect reality” (see AT 7 46, CSM 2 31, and Cottingham p. 261).
Cottingham here touches upon an important aspect of Descartes’s view of God and of our knowledge of God who is an object of distinct understanding yet beyond our full comprehension. As Cottingham points out, Descartes’s view of God as something infinitely beyond us, the understanding of which is closely linked to our awareness of our own weakness and finitude, joins a long tradition that begins with St. Bonaventure. Like so many other themes that Descartes picks up, however, he puts this conception of God to original use. The contemplation of the true God is not only the source of all wisdom including knowledge of all the sciences (AT 7 53 CSM 2 37, Cottingham 262-263). God establishes the laws of nature endowing us with the notions mirroring them, making our finite human minds “in principle capable of reflecting the mathematical and logical structures laid down by our Creator in the workings of the universe” (p. 264). The role of God in Descartes’s system thus goes beyond that of “a mysterious ‘prime mover’ or ‘first cause’” of the kind Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas envisage, or that of the initial mover who in Pascal’s caricature “flicks” the universe into motion leaving it to its own devices, because God is also the “sole perpetual dynamic force in a cosmos” otherwise reduced to “inert extended matter” (p. 265).
One could go further and claim with Spinoza that God is reality or nature itself revealed to us under some of its infinite attributes. This line of thought is often overlooked but it is strongly suggested in many places, not least by Descartes’s recurring Platonist language in the Meditations and elsewhere, which identifies being, perfection and truth. Descartes’s God is neither merely the source of motion nor an external warrant of truth. Through his continuous and perpetual process of creation God is being and truth itself. Cottingham comes close to recognizing as much in writing that “divine power and intelligence thus emerges, in Descartes’s system, as the true source of all reality — both of everything there is, and of all human knowledge of everything there is”. God is absolutely central “for his entire metaphysical and physical system” (p. 265). I readily agree, but must ask how this fits with the suggestions made earlier that Descartes got into metaphysics only to compensate for epistemological lacunas or to support his science.
In the very next section of the paper, Cottingham appears to retreat to his earlier view in remarking that “it might seem that the divine role is chiefly invoked by Descartes as a necessary structural support for his scientific system” (pp. 265-266). In fact he goes beyond it in insisting that ‘scientific’ be given a sufficiently “broad” sense. The sense Cottingham has in mind is that of “philosophy” as in Descartes’s “tree of philosophy”, which includes among its branches “morals”, understood as “the highest and most perfect moral system which presupposes a complete knowledge of the other sciences, and is the ultimate level of wisdom” (AT 9B 14, CSM 1 186). It is, Cottingham argues, because the philosophical system is rooted in theistic metaphysics that morals can emerge as one of its branches. The God who is the source of the physical universe is also the source of goodness, and according to the “Platonic model” by which Descartes is “more than a little influenced”, the true and the good “are aspects of a single underlying reality” (p. 267). Again, I would go further, since what Descartes does, following his Platonic predecessors, is to identify being and perfection, or, if you wish, the true and the good. Cottingham does not dwell on this fascinating topic but completes his account by discussing the role of God in Cartesian ethics, such as his theory of assent and the theodicy offered in the Fourth Meditation.
The most interesting paper in the collection bearing on these themes is the last, “Plato’s Sun and Descartes’s Stove: Contemplation and Control in Cartesian Philosophy” (2007). Here Cottingham returns to reflecting on the tensions in Descartes’s philosophical project between the ambitions of the mathematical scientist and the theological and ethical agenda of the metaphysically bent philosopher. He argues that Descartes has become the “archetypal Janus figure — the leading herald of our modern age whose thought was at the same time closely grafted onto the medieval and classical tradition that made it possible”. Keeping track both of his proximity to and at the same time distance from us may give us a better sense of the distinctly philosophical interest that his ideas continue to present, deepening also our understanding of some of the tensions operating beneath the surface of our own contemporary philosophical worldview (p. 294). Cottingham goes on to observe that even though it is easy to find parallels to Platonic cosmology in his scientific writings, Descartes plants, from early on, the seed of the idea that
all one needs in order to provide an adequate explanation of the cosmos … is a set of initial conditions specifying certain quantities of matter in motion (its particles defined in terms of size and shape), plus certain universal laws governing the subsequent movements of those particles. (p. 297)
Nature, as the opening paragraph of Chapter 7 of Le Monde explains, is not a “Goddess or any other sort of imaginary power” but “matter itself, in so far as I am considering it taken together with all the qualities I have attributed to it”, and all the changes of which can be explained in terms of the ‘laws of nature’. The divine presence in nature is hereby reduced to a minimum and nature treated as an autonomously operating system. Descartes has thus distanced himself from the Christianized Platonism of the Renaissance, reducing the physical world to “a neutral, inanimate, purely mechanical plenum” (p. 300).
It would be helpful, in framing contrasts like these, to distinguish more clearly between, on the one hand, Descartes’s model of scientific explanation that bans any appeal to God or his ends as being beyond human comprehension, and, on the other hand, his ontology with God at the very center representing reality in its fullest or highest degree. If the ontology resonates with Platonist themes, these are used selectively, and a key element, teleology, is absent. For as Cottingham justly points out, the Cartesian God, who creates the “eternal truths” as well as the laws of nature ex nihilo is very different from the God of the rationalists — early or late — in the Platonic tradition:
We may have a clear and distinct grasp of the fundamental logical and mathematical principles by which the universe operates … , and in this sense we may think of the human mind as mirror of nature. But because these truths are contingent on the divine will, the ultimate rationale for them, if any, must remain opaque to us. (p. 301)
Cottingham concludes that Descartes is much closer to Hume and his successors than to his Platonic predecessors, since “the gap between acknowledging an inscrutable divine fiat and simply accepting the unexplained explanatory postulates of modern secular science of physics seems to be wafer thin” (p. 302). Keeping scientific methodology and metaphysics apart as suggested above, one could say that Descartes is just about as radical as Hume in his conception of science where, pace foundationalist readings, God is made superfluous. But since Descartes does not take it that science exhausts reality, he can hold on to a realist and Plato-inspired conception of being for which neither science nor speculative metaphysics can fully account.
Cottingham finds Descartes divided between two opposed mindsets, one that he labels ‘contemplative’, and one that he labels ‘controlling’. Descartes’s attraction to the first is “most unmistakably” expressed, he thinks, in the Fourth Meditation account of the intellect and the will which echoes neo-Platonist illumination theories: the key to true illumination, for Descartes as for St. Bonaventure, is “the exercise of the will operating in conjunction with the light of the intellect” (p. 305). The Meditator’s voice in the Third Meditation is also that of a Platonic lover of wisdom, using a mode of thought where analytic philosophizing and religious contemplation come together. The tone here, Cottingham says, is “less one of critical scrutiny than of humble submission” (p. 306). Descartes’s journey retraces that of Bonaventure where the idea of perfection goes before that of the discovery of my own imperfections (p. 307). One can agree to this last claim, yet, talking of mindsets, humility does not strike one as the most fitting description of Descartes’s bent of mind, not even in its most contemplative mode. A more skeptical reader can find a good dose of self-satisfaction and perhaps self-love in his Third Meditation adoration of the omnipotent God enlightening his intellect and in whose infinite will he mirrors his own in the Fourth Meditation.
Be that as it may, Cottingham wants to emphasize the contrast between the contemplative mind-set (symbolized by the Sun) and the mind-set characteristic of the early modern, technocratic and activist outlook (symbolized by the Cartesian stove) running through “all or much of Descartes’s work”. The first stands for God as “an object of awe and worship, to be gazed on, as Descartes says, ‘in so far as the eye of my darkened intellect can bear it’” (AT 7 52, cited on p. 308). The latter is said to have found one of its earliest expressions in the Discourse where Descartes heralds our transformation into “maitres et possesseurs de la nature” (masters and lords of nature, AT VI 62, CSM 1 142-3).
At times Cottingham seems carried away by the Platonizing themes recurring in Descartes’s metaphysics. One may ask: how much contemplation can a philosopher who advises his best student not to occupy her thoughts with too much metaphysics and claims himself to spend no more time than a couple of hours per year on it really allow for (AT 3 692-3)? The two mindsets seem to be in constant interaction, and are both at work in Descartes’s problematic account of human nature. Having gone through her once-in-a-lifetime exercise in First Philosophy, where the degrees of reality and hierarchy of values are put in place and perspective, the reader (or meditator) is brought back to the stove to contemplate her own imperfect nature and how to amend it. While in the Third, the Fourth and the Fifth Meditations the strengths and weaknesses of her intellect and will are revealed, she is brought to confront in the Sixth all the additional limitations that her embodied condition sets on her cognitive capacities. She now knows the extent of her dependence on the being to which she owes her existence and whatever perfection she finds in herself, including her unlimited will and how to check it. Control, henceforth, is not just about submitting nature to your own ends, but even more about controlling yourself and the impulses of nature (that of the compositum), which far from submitting to the Light of Nature (or reason) act on their own, as it were blindly. Where in the philosophical tradition would Cottingham place this new hybrid conception of human being, one that with all its problems, uncertainties and promises seems to capture so many of our modern anxieties as at once masters and helpless subjects of our own, as we are pleased to think, unlimited power of control?
Cottingham rightly sees the active controlling mode taking precedence over the quietist contemplative mode of Platonic and Stoic-inspired approaches in Descartes’s moral philosophy. If the power of science can control and modify external conditions, the psycho-therapy of the passions can help manage and redirect the passions. Cottingham agrees with G. Rodis-Lewis about the streaks of hubris in this project, but he thinks that the older Platonic and Augustinian resonances in his system keep them in check. The good life for Descartes is not in the end “the autonomous power to recreate ourselves or the environment, but the use of our God-given free will to bring our lives into conformity with divinely generated truth and goodness” (p. 314).
The reading defended in “The Intellect, the Will, and the Passions: Spinoza’s Critique of Descartes” (1988) supports the priority given to the contemplative in Descartes’s ethical thinking. Cottingham takes issue with Spinoza’s and Leibniz’s criticisms of Descartes which, he argues, exaggerate his “libertarianism”. (I would much prefer the term “voluntarism” here since the debate, which concerns judgment and rational, moral choice is not exactly the modern one about free will and causation.)4 Descartes’s true position, Cottingham argues, is much closer to Spinoza’s than often supposed. When Spinoza famously, and in opposition to Descartes, claims that all ideas come with affirmations, and that will and intellect are one and the same (see Ethics 2p49 with corollaries and demonstrations) — a view Cottingham with many other commentators sees as sensible — this, far from being fatal to Descartes’s position, misrepresents it. For there are many ideas, like that of the three angles of a triangle being equal to two right angles used by Spinoza to illustrate his argument, where Descartes would allow that “believing a proposition is not … entirely within the control of the will” (p. 197). He refers to the Fourth Meditation doctrine where Descartes affirms that “I could not but judge that something which I understood so clearly was true” (AT 7 58, CSM 2 41).
So at least in the case of clear and distinct perception, Spinoza’s account “has some striking affinities with what Descartes himself says when he argues that clear and distinct perception is inseparable from assent” (p. 198). The same, Cottingham argues, holds in the case of inadequate perception. Suspension of judgement for Descartes is not, “so to speak, an arbitrary act of the will” but occurs, as in the case of the celebrated method of doubt, “when meditative reflection has thrown up reasons for mistrusting previously held beliefs” (p. 201). The will does not directly control assent. Instead “we decide to follow up a certain line of argument that reveals the inadequacy of the grounds for our previously held beliefs”, and this is a matter of intellectual recognition.
This comes close to the description of suspension of belief given by Spinoza (at least on standard readings of his view), but a key question remains: what is baked into the process of deciding to inspect one’s previously held beliefs? If assent were always to be given to the side appearing to have more reasons in its favor, nothing would restrain giving assent to that side. On the other hand, as Spinoza so cleverly objects, if the balance is equal, in cases of indifference, the intellect could not move at all but would be in the position of Buridan’s ass, perishing from hunger between two equally distant piles of hay. Cottingham takes Spinoza’s comments on this in his Ethics (E 2p49dem.iv) as good arguments “against the existence of pure libertarian free will conceived by some philosophers” (p.208). Cottingham has “some existentialists” in mind here, but thinks this criticism misses its intended target. For Descartes "did not make the notion of a two-way contra-causal power central to his account of freedom (except in the case of God) and the type of freedom he defends is ‘liberté éclairée’ " where “the ‘determination of the will’ is always linked to the ‘prior perception of the intellect’” (AT 7 60, CSM 2 45). This is indeed the highest grade of freedom for Descartes, but the question here is whether judgement or moral choice is the result of causal determination by the greater good perceived — in which case Descartes’s position would indeed turn into Spinozistic (or Leibnizian) “necessitarianism” — or of an autonomous will that moves itself to endorse it.
I have discussed this elsewhere and cannot go into it here.5 Nevertheless it is good to consider that there are philosophers other than “existentialists”, many of them among Descartes’s medieval predecessors, Duns Scotus for instance, who defended a greater autonomy of the will than the Thomists allowed for, and whose views Leibniz opposed as much as those of Descartes, since he saw them as conflicting with his own kind of rational ethical determinism. Those “scotists” whom Leibniz abhorred read their Aristotle more in the light of Augustine’s doctrine than in that of Aquinas’s commentaries. It is also a matter of debate how central the two-way power Cottingham mentions was to Descartes’s confusing account of freedom in the Fourth Meditation. It certainly comes up first in his characterization of free choice even though his ensuing gloss on it may seem to cover it up under the more “common” doctrine of the school (AT 7 58, CSM 2 40). But Descartes at least tries to explain it by distinguishing between two kinds of indifference and also different stages in the process of deliberation in the famous letter to Mesland of 1645 (AT 4 173-175, CSMK 244-246), which Cottingham does not mention at all and which makes it possible to read the quoted passages in a different light. The medieval voluntarists who talked about the indeterminacy of the will took their inspiration from Augustine’s account of the will as a self-mover. It is not farfetched to think that Descartes picked up this theme along with the many others that he made his own from the Augustinian tradition. It is of a piece with his doctrine of God’s power and the identification of the divine will, intellect and power, the creation of eternal truths, and lastly, the order of perfections where the active always takes precedence over the passive.
The complexities, tensions, contradictions and many promissory notes of Descartes’s philosophical writing can hardly be captured in a series of studies of journal paper format. Yet the topics covered by Cottingham extend very widely and offer nuanced and often instructive reflections both on controversial Cartesian views that still challenge his commentators, and on their simplified canonical images that continue to haunt contemporary discussions. They range from Descartes’s scientific agenda to his treatment of specific problems like the nature of thought, animal consciousness, color, language, will, belief and reason, theology and ethics. Taken together, they offer a stimulating picture both of Descartes’s influential and often controversial views and of Cottingham’s longstanding engagement with them.
1 The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, transl. by J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, Vols. 1-2, Cambridge University Press 1984-1985, including The Philosophical Writings of Descartes-The Correspondence, transl. by J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, A. Kenny, Vol. 3, Cambridge University Press, 1991.
2 The references are to the standard Latin and French edition Oeuvres de Descartes, vols. 1-12, edited by C. Adam and P. Tannery, revised edition, Paris: Vrin/C.N.R.S., 1964-76 (hereafter AT) and the standard English edition referred to in the note above (hereafter CSM or CSMK).